The Politics and Pedagogy of Mourning: On Responsibility in Eulogy

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Timothy Secret, The Politics and Pedagogy of Mourning: On Responsibility in Eulogy, Bloomsbury, 2015, 261pp, $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472575142.

Reviewed by Dawne McCance, University of Manitoba


In his Preface to this provocative and challenging study, Timothy Secret takes care to point out that his is not "a work on Derrida," not "a piece of Derrida scholarship," but a text that "cannot be readily pigeonholed under his proper name" (xxii). Readers might well take this caution to heart, for although the book moves from the outset toward an analysis of Derrida's eulogies, neither Derrida's work in general, nor his eulogies in particular, constitutes the focus of Secret's project. For his main interest, more largely theoretical, concerns the structures and "mechanisms" that lay the ground for, and culminate in, Derrida's eulogies. In his words, the book works "to put in place a framework that will allow Derrida's eulogies to open their riches to us" (177). To construct this framework, he draws from the work of Levinas, Freud, and especially Nicolas Abraham and Mária Török, giving some attention to Heidegger's existential analysis of Dasein's being toward death as such. Only in the sixth and final chapter, "The Address of Eulogy," does Secret turn to Derrida's eulogies themselves, and only briefly, considering four texts out of some twenty that he refers to as "explicit" acts of eulogy and, resisting close reading of the selected texts, drawing but one theme from each of the four.

The question with which Secret opens -- not "Why eulogies?" but rather, "Why psychoanalysis?" -- heralds his overriding interest throughout this study: the internal or internalized dead, or as he puts it, here with reference to Derrida, "those who clearly no longer exist in themselves as they did when alive yet who cannot simply be reduced to a narcissistic fantasy within a properly closed subjectivity" (xviii). It is psychoanalysis, or what he refers to a psychoanalytic technology, that provides Secret with a theoretical-conceptual account through which he can make intelligible the persistence of the dead within the living and the responsible inheritance of the living dead, for example, in the instance of eulogy. Thus he writes:

Perhaps the peculiar feeling of responsibility to the dead themselves that we experience when called upon to give an act of eulogy -- the feeling of standing before them, of still being looked at by them and called by them to do justice to them -- can only be rendered rationally intelligible through psychoanalysis (xxi).

The standard of rational intelligibility proves important to Secret throughout his book, which is curious since he relies on psychoanalytic theories that render the psychic realm much more vast and significant than the conscious-rational mind. The same rational standard circumscribes his reading of Derrida, for instance in the second chapter, where, in the process of constructing his theoretical framework, Secret approaches Derrida himself by way of a series of terms, "hinge words" (27), that contribute to understanding how his address of eulogy functions. Deconstruction emerges as one of these terms, along with différance, trace, pharmakon, sheaf, and others, each of which Secret attempts, more or less, to explicate if not to define -- even if, as he writes at one point that, "any reader who opens Derrida to (almost) any page will encounter a written style that defies comprehension" (55). There are moments of insight in this second chapter and indeed throughout this book, although at times Secret's endeavor to build a rationally intelligible theoretical scaffold seems, to me at least, to overtake his attempts to open Derrida's terms and texts. The same, I think, applies to the chapter on "The Scene of Writing," where, engaging Freud in large part through Derrida, Secret yet finds in psychoanalysis a "strong and coherent system" (115) that renders intelligible a set of "physico-mechanical processes" (116), a system that can be explained in thetic terms. This seems to me much unlike the scene of writing that Derrida considers in "Freud and the Scene of Writing," and even more so in his close reading of Freud's Beyond the Pleasure Principle in The Post Card ("To Speculate -- on 'Freud'"), a "scene" that, for Derrida, cannot be contained within any positional or oppositional logic.

Secret's passion for his material is nowhere more evident than in his chapters on Levinas and Abraham and Török. The latter chapter, moving from Freud, Sándor Ferenczi, and Hegel to Abraham and Török, develops an account of pre-originary mourning that is crucial to Secret's theoretical framework. Indeed, in his words, "the weakness of several texts focused on [Derrida's] eulogies has been an ignorance of the specificities of both introjection and incorporation in Abraham and Török's works" (177). Preliminary to this consideration of psychoanalysis, Secret inserts a chapter that probes Levinas's theorizing of ethics and politics, finding his position to be insufficient in accounting for our responsibility to the dead but at the same time a necessary prelude to psychoanalysis.

Two points, interwoven through this book, merit special mention and far more attention than I can give them here. The first concerns the pedagogical implications of our overall responsibility to the dead, and of Derrida's eulogies in particular. Secret offers many insights here. The second, closely related to the first, concerns his contention that we need to engage with Derrida's eulogies prior to taking up his political works. On these points and overall, this is a book to read.