The Politics of Our Selves: Power, Autonomy, and Gender in Contemporary Critical Theory

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Amy Allen, The Politics of Our Selves: Power, Autonomy, and Gender in Contemporary Critical Theory, Columbia University Press, 2008, 230pp., $34.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231136228.

Reviewed by J. Jeremy Wisnewski, Hartwick College


In her recent book, Amy Allen tackles one of the persistent problems of post-Foucaultian critical theory: how can we acknowledge the pervasive mechanisms of power in the formation of our identities, and yet still allow for an ideal of autonomous action? This problem -- one that has been a sticking point in the discussion between Foucaultians and Habermasians -- has also come to be an issue of much importance in the feminist literature. The Politics of Our Selves is a persuasive and well-reasoned account of how we might find our way through some difficult -- some might say 'intractable' -- problems of contemporary feminism and critical theory. The book demonstrates that the perceived opposition between power and knowledge is something of a red herring. Recognizing this, moreover, has important consequences for some of feminism's most serious debates -- as well as for understanding the appropriate parameters of a critical theory.

The Politics of Our Selves begins by rethinking the Foucault/Habermas debate -- a debate that centers on the place of critique in the network of power. In reading Foucault's work, where power 'is everywhere' and is that in virtue of which agents are constructed and placed within systems of normalization and subordination, a persistent worry seems to arise: if power is absolutely everywhere, how is it possible to engage in the critique of power in such a way that we might (at least partially) liberate ourselves from the oppressive aspects of power? If power pervades everything, it follows that it pervades rationality, and hence that the use of rationality itself is riddled with the very means of subordination we are trying to overcome. It is precisely this criticism that has been leveled against the Foucaultian enterprise by philosophers like Habermas and Charles Taylor.

It is in this debate that Allen makes her first significant contribution to our thinking through the relation of power and knowledge with an eye to the possibility of transformative critique. In Chapters 2 and 3, Allen aims to show that Foucault's analysis of power has been (largely) misunderstood as the repudiation of critique, when in fact Foucault's work is a call to critique:

What Foucault is calling for is a critique of critique, which means not only a criticism of Kant's project for the way in which it closes off the very opening for thought that it had created but also a critique in the Kantian sense of the term -- that is, an interrogation of the limits and conditions of possibility of that which Kant himself took as his own starting point, namely, the transcendental subject. (35)

Foucault's aim is thus, in essence, an attempt to up the ante of critical theory: instead of assuming the capacity of a pure rationality, embedded in a power-free subject, to determine what is and should be, Foucault wants to critically analyze the very notion of subjectivity in the historical conditions which produce it. This by no means entails that critique is no longer possible. Rather, it entails that critique, if it is to be worthy of the name, must be sensitive to the historical forces at work on our own capacities to be selves and our ability to achieve autonomy. Once we have reconceived Foucault's endeavor in this manner, it becomes much easier to see that "the differences between Habermas's and Foucault's projects have been seriously overstated" (42). Allen's analysis, I think, marks a significant advance in the way we should understand the tension between Foucault and Habermas. The 'stand off' between these philosophers is rightly revealed as a distraction, the importance of which has been overblown on all sides. As is so often the case, what is required to get past a dispute is not dogmatic posturing, but nuance. Allen's reading of Foucault and Habermas brings this in spades, resulting in a much more persuasive understanding of the tension between Foucault and Habermas as based primarily on misunderstanding.

Understanding the Foucault/Habermas debate as resting on a misconception both of Foucault's relation to critique, on the one hand, and Habermas's own notion of the relation of reason and power (which Allen examines in Chapter 5), on the other, allows Allen to make a major step forward in the project of The Politics of Our Selves: namely, "to figure out how to understand autonomy such that it is compatible with an understanding of power in all its depth and complexity" (21). This, in turn, makes it possible to consider the relevance of power/knowledge to some particular debates in critical theory in general, and feminism in particular.

One such debate concerns the importance of power in the construction of sex and gender, and how getting beyond sex/gender might be accomplished. If power is pervasive and constitutive of identity, it looks as though abandoning gendered identity might amount to abandoning identity as such, at least given our current episteme (to use a Foucaultian term). Butler (and other feminists) have criticized the view that a recognition of the contingency and plasticity of gender constructions is sufficient to eliminate them. This view ignores the power of such constructions over us. Indeed, it ignores that these constructions are us. The problem, fundamentally, is that it is only through such power-laden constructions that we have an identity. Forced to choose between having an identity that subjugates and having no identity at all, individuals choose to carry on the very sex/gender constructions that have hitherto oppressed them.

Judith Butler's important analysis, however, goes too far. Yet another virtue of Allen's book is to show us why this is the case, and to demonstrate that acknowledging the precarious position of sexed/gendered-identity can actually facilitate a more thoughtful approach to the intersection of power and autonomy. Butler claims that all identity is essentially subjugated in virtue of simply being born and hence depending on the recognition of others. This involves forcing us, in the very process of becoming individuals, to accept extrinsic social requirements in order to be recognized by those whose love we need and desire. As Allen shows, however, this view conflates "dependence and subordination" (84). When we see this, we recognize the possibility of "moments of mutual recognition … within on-going, dynamically unfolding, social relationships" (91). This, then, allows us to see that we can have our identities, constituted as they are by recognition, in a way that need not involve subjugation, despite the fact that "there is no possible human social world from which power has been completely eliminated" (91). Any conception of the social that does not acknowledge the problems and prospects of such mutual recognition -- recognition that can be transformative -- will ultimately be too narrow.

The most important contribution of Allen's book, though, is not merely her re-thinking of the Foucault/Habermas debate, nor her understanding of how this is relevant to some current debates in feminism. As I see it, the most suggestive and important part of Allen's book is the vision of what results from dealing with these debates. For Allen, critical theory is a contextualized analysis of the interstices and intersections of power and autonomy -- one that recognizes the limits of rationality in engaging in critique, but one that also recognizes its importance.

Allen's revision of Habermasian critical theory (which defends a strong distinction between power and validity) is one part of this important re-conceiving of the aims and methods of critical theory. On Allen's view, the distinction between power and knowledge is insufficient in its recognition of the way that power pervades our social and communicative relationships. Instead of seeing power as a constitutive element of our interaction, Habermas views power as mere distortion. As Allen remarks, Habermas "does not take seriously enough the possibility of the mixing of power and validity claims at the theoretical level. Indeed, he seems to think that he cannot take this possibility seriously without sacrificing his notion of validity itself" (135). Allen's analysis is aimed at providing a revision of Habermas's notion of context-transcending validity claims in light of situated, ensconced power structures. Put bluntly, Allen aims to articulate a 'contextualized transcendence' -- which, as strange as it sounds, serves to unite Foucault and Habermas in a way that advances the theoretical ambitions of critical theory. On Allen's view, we need to

reject the false opposition between radical contextualism and the commitment to reason's actual capacity to transcend its situatedness by developing instead a principled form of contextualism that emphasizes our need both to posit context-transcending ideals and to continually unmask their status as illusions rooted in interest and power-laden contexts. (148)

Part of what is involved in recognizing our situatedness is to recognize the way that we are constructed in social space. Herein lies, again, the relevance of this critical-theoretic approach to feminism: we are situated in sex/gender in a way that informs even our ability to reason through our possible alternatives. Allen criticizes the view (which she attributes to Benhabib) that gender is just one more narrative structure in which we understand ourselves, insisting that this structure has become unavoidable -- that it pervades our interactions with others at the earliest stages: babies in cribs are gendered by those around them. "Not only the content of our narratives but also their structure and form varies along gender lines, and this variation tends to reproduce individuals who conform to gender stereotypes" (168).

Recognizing how deep the gendering of individuals goes -- and how early it starts -- the task of a critical theory cannot be simply to embrace some notion of 'critical choice' of which maximally rational agents are capable. The aim of critical theory must rather be to identify and expose the landscape of our social world in a way that promotes the possibility of mutual recognition that can be transformative. In this way, Allen's project is squarely in the tradition of critical theory: the aim is to achieve liberation through a critique of the ideological forces present in our social structure. It is post-Foucaultian critical theory in that our aim is not to uncover some unique 'truth' about ourselves prior to our construction in social space (there's nothing to find). It is feminist critical theory in that our aim is to recognize the often-oppressive centrality of gendered construction in this social space. Finally, the aim is emancipatory, not in the sense that the truth may set us free, but rather in the sense that our exploration of structured social space might allow us to better approach moments of mutual recognition -- moments that can potentially be transformative of those agents involved in such moments.

If there is one part of Allen's book that is underdeveloped, it is her treatment of the more practical question of how a critical theory can approach changing the experience of those persons today who recognize the oppressive character of sex/gender identity, and yet cling to it as that which is constitutive of their identities. As Allen notes, rational critique is insufficient for change. One also needs what she calls 'motivational capacity' -- that is, "the motivational capacity to change who we want to be" (183). This is a crucially important point, but one which, to my mind, does not go quite far enough. Sadly, in addition to those who recognize the oppressive character of gender identity and nevertheless cling to it, there are the slow-to-move masses who only cling, without any recognition of the nature of that to which they cling. I am pessimistic that, even once they are educated (if we can carry this off), we will not be able to motivate such persons to do enough to end the tyranny of gender.

Early feminists thought it would be enough to change what we think about sex and gender. As Allen and others have shown, our thinking is woefully inadequate to actually change our practices. Reason is indeed the slave of the passions. Without the will to instantiate change, no amount of knowledge will be sufficient to actually motivate us to change our practices (and Allen certainly sees this). But likewise, no such motivation can arise from practices that are already saturated in sex/gendered power-structures that are identity-constituting. We require not just a change in motivation, but a change in sight -- a change in how we perceive the importance of sex/gender as well as how we perceive its very existence. Motivational capacity, I fear, will not come from books or articles. It probably won't even come from the scores of feminists who continue to enable us to see what is wrong with the gendered society by engaging in visible activism. We require a changed phenomenology of gender, not merely more knowledge or more motivation. Allen is right that motivation is required to make knowledge active. But, if my pessimistic appraisal is correct, we will only find our motivation when our phenomenology of sex and gender is somehow altered. I, for one, do not know how we can do this -- perhaps through film and literature, perhaps through creative transgressions, but perhaps not at all.

One book can only do so much -- and Allen's book, I think, has done quite a lot. I do hope that, at some future date, Allen will bring her significant intelligence to bear on the additional problem of how to change gender phenomenology -- for it is this task, I think, that remains crucial for any living and workable critical theory. Once we have settled the theoretical questions surrounding the place of rationality in the confines of power, and the place of recognition in an onslaught of subordination, we will still face the problem of changing the social perception of gender as such. For now, though, we will have to settle for the theoretical advances that Allen's The Politics of Our Selves provides.