The Politics of Persons: Individual Autonomy and Socio-historical Selves

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John Christman, The Politics of Persons: Individual Autonomy and Socio-historical Selves, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 274pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521760560.

Reviewed by Michael Schefczyk, Leuphana University Lueneburg


Over the last two decades, John Christman devoted much of his intellectual energy to analyzing the concept of individual autonomy. He was thus excellently prepared for tackling a most interesting problem: how should we conceive democratic legitimacy if we take note of the complexities and subtleties that the concept of autonomy involves? Juergen Habermas, an author with whom Christman sympathizes in many regards, remarks that private and public autonomy are "co-original". But what, precisely, is autonomy? What is this thing that legitimate political orders are supposed to respect? Christman's book is highly helpful in answering such questions. The first part examines the concept of "selves", the second is devoted to autonomy and the third part outlines Christman's conception of democratic justice. At one point, Christman concedes that he glosses over some topics a bit quickly. This applies mainly to the relatively short third part of the book. But the complex and tight train of thought is never obscure or excessively taxing to read.

The book pursues an "ecumenical" project. Christman accepts many critical arguments concerning the understanding and value of autonomy in Western political thought, but his general outlook remains close to Rawls' political liberalism. One may read the book as an attempt to present a version of political liberalism that is admissible for communitarians, feminists and critical race theorists who accuse traditional liberalism of ignoring the social and historical nature of the self. Liberals frequently maintain that this challenge misrepresents liberalism. According to them, liberalism does not advocate social atomism; it is well aware that the self has a social and historical nature. They argue that the crucial point of liberalism is that autonomous agents are able to enter and leave social relations in accordance with their own preferences and value judgments. Correspondingly, social ties should be seen as associations.

Christman animadverts that this liberal stance is untenable. First, not all social groupings are associations in the relevant sense. The author gives gender and race as examples. Second, even if it is possible to give up relations and acquire new ones, people often consider them to be an integral and inalterable part of their identity. For reasons like these, Christman abandons the traditional liberal idea that autonomy involves the capacity to form and dissolve social relations at will. Some people have commitments which define them so completely that requiring the ability to reject those commitments would amount to introducing "an unrealistic demand for autonomy as a social value" (123).

In Christman's account the core requirement of autonomy is the ability of self-reflection. Since neither that a person has the psychological ability to revise her commitments nor that she has the opportunity to pursue diverse life-paths is a necessary condition for autonomous agency, autonomy is compatible with living a life of deep and unquestioned social relations and value commitments. A person is autonomous if her way of life is expressive of her "true self", or, in other words, if she is not alienated from her existence. Whether this is the case has to be found out by sustained self-reflection. If a person's embedded and sustained self-reflection is not conducive to alienation, she leads an autonomous life, even if she would not be able to reject her basic commitments. Alienation, in turn, "involves feeling constrained by the trait and wanting decidedly to repudiate it" (143), which amounts to a combination of judgment and affective reaction over a variety of situations in the light of one's autobiographical narrative.

It is important to note that Christman conceives the condition of self-reflection in a counterfactual way, and this seems problematic for two reasons. First, hypothetical self-reflection seems too weak a requirement for autonomy; second, it is in conflict with Christman's claim regarding the "representational authority" of groups. Let me begin with the first point. If an appropriate examination of our commitments by us would not lead to our alienation from these commitments, we count as autonomous. Thus, even if we never took pains to pose the Socratic question what a good life is, even if we would lead our lives in the deepest dogmatic slumber, we could have full autonomy in Christman's sense. I find this account too extreme. Christman is certainly right that reflective awareness is not the only way in which "we grow, change, and engage in important and valued activities" (157). Nonetheless, at least some degree of actual (in contrast to hypothetical) reflection seems to be essential for autonomy.

But maybe my first objection misses Christman's central concern, and this leads me to my second plea. In order to understand it, one must not forget that Christman discusses autonomy mainly as a political status and not as a character ideal. Only if we view autonomous persons as able to reflect on their values and social relations do their commitments count as a reason "for the rest of us in our interactions with them" (13). I agree that it makes sense to say that a person's standing in political deliberation depends on her autonomy. But this claim loses its plausibility if one combines Christman's anti-perfectionism and his account of hypothetical self-reflection. Let me explain. In Christman's usage, perfectionists claim that the "validity" of certain values does not depend on a person's own judgments. Substantive accounts of autonomy that maintain the incompatibility of autonomy with certain value commitments -- for instance, a military code of honor which demands unconditional obedience to superior orders -- are perfectionist in Christman's understanding of the term. Pursuant to some versions of "perfectionism", a person can count as non-autonomous, even if she wholeheartedly affirms certain values and traditions on sustained critical reflection in the light of her autobiographical narrative. Christman, in contrast, advocates an inclusive and proceduralist conception according to which traditional ways of social life, which offend Western individualism, should not be discounted as non-autonomous by definition. "Liberation from oppression must be undertaken within a normative framework that leaves the most room for disparate voices, even those who endorse traditional and authoritarian value systems" (173).

Maybe this slightly paradoxical view (liberation from oppression must leave room for authoritarian value systems) is the price one has to pay if one conceives authority over one's own autobiographical narrative (past, present and future) to be the core idea of autonomy. Perhaps people who autonomously endorse authoritarian value systems should not lose their standing as participants in democratic deliberation. They should have authority over their own lives and should be able to make their viewpoints heard in the course of political deliberation and decision-making. In this sense, one may say that "leaving room for authoritarian value systems" can be conceived as a form of "liberation from oppression" under certain circumstances.

But this idea jars with Christman's requirement of hypothetical self-reflection. According to the latter, it is conceivable that we take the commitments of certain people seriously (count them as reasons) because we assume that they would not be alienated from these commitments, were they to reflect on them. Thus, "the rest of us" can, in principle, judge in lieu of others whether they are autonomous or not. This, however, has a decidedly objectivist (perfectionist) flavor which is in conflict with the main line of attack of Christman's book. Time and again, he emphasizes the importance of being able to "speak for oneself" in political matters. But the point of this right is lost if we do not assume that those who speak for themselves know what they are talking about, i.e., that they reflectively appraised their way of life. The hypothetical reflection model of autonomy conflicts with the idea that agents should have representational authority in the political realm because they generally know best what is good for them. It is difficult to see why "the rest of us" should acknowledge the authority over someone's own autobiographical narrative, if this person does not have at least a minimal degree of actual sustained self-reflection.

Let me supplement this point. Like Rawls, Christman assumes that modern, pluralist societies are characterized by reasonable disagreements and that it would be wrong to base the justification of political values and principles on controversial comprehensive doctrines. But in sharp contrast to Rawls, Christman is convinced that his own socio-historical conception of autonomy supports identity-based political claims. For instance, he avers that it would probably cause "alienation" among current members "of certain marginalized groups" if the political system would refuse to recognize special needs on their part, needs which are associated with a history characterized by oppression and degradation. Pursuant to Christman, the core of the demand for recognition consists in the claim to "be recognized as fully able to define" the interests tied to the membership of a discriminated group. That autonomous agents must be empowered to speak for themselves in the political arena is not only a matter of respect with regard to the affected groups and persons; it is also a requirement for the legitimate use of political power. If the citizens' interests were static and objective, Christman argues, then democratic practices would only be complementary to just political institutions. In fact, they are "constitutive of the establishment and maintenance of the legitimacy of those institutions" (225) because the embedded self-reflection, which is a necessary condition of autonomy (and, consequently, legitimacy), evolves in processes of public deliberation.

Perfectionist conceptions claim that it is, under certain conditions, compatible with the autonomy of the citizens (and, consequently, legitimate) to use political power against the citizens' judgment and expressed will. If we abandon perfectionism, though, we have to base the legitimate use of political power on appropriate procedures which accord citizens "representational authority" regarding their values, interests and opinions in political deliberation. To repeat the point already made, this seems to presuppose that the citizens reflect on these values, interests and opinions and that they are prepared to justify them in the context of political debates. As I see it, if one abandons perfectionism, one has to claim that the reason "for the rest of us" to acknowledge the representational authority of groups and persons is a certain minimal degree of actual (in contrast to hypothetical) self-reflection.

On balance, this objection by no means diminishes my high regard for Christman's fine philosophical book. Concerning political theory, it is maybe its most remarkable achievement to make clear to what great extent Rawls' political liberalism and Habermas' theory of deliberative democracy can be seen as contiguous.