The Positive Function of Evil

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Pedro Alexis Tabensky (ed.), The Positive Function of Evil, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 185pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230219557.

Reviewed by Stewart Goetz, Ursinus College



The Positive Function of Evil, which is edited by Pedro Alexis Tabensky, is an interesting collection of essays (only one of which has been previously published) that are organized around the central idea that evils lead to certain key ethical goods and, thereby, have an important positive role to play in making our lives good. The essays are largely secular in nature, though a couple of them engage the central idea of the book from a religious perspective. Because of limitations of space, I cannot discuss every essay in the collection and will focus on those that I found particularly interesting.

I begin, where the book begins, with Robert Merrihew Adams’ previously published piece entitled “Love and the Problem of Evil”. For guidance in thinking about the positive function of evil, Adams turns to the following comment by Leibniz in response to interlocutors who are indignant that God did not substitute better human creatures for the fallen Adam and Eve:

If God had done that, … a vastly different series of things, vastly different combinations of circumstances, persons, and marriages, and vastly different persons would have been produced, and hence if sin had been taken away or extinguished, they themselves would not be in the world. They therefore have no reason to be angry at Adam or Eve for sinning, much less at God for permitting the sin, since they must rather credit their own existence to this very toleration of sins. (2)

Adams goes on to reflect about the fact that it is extremely unlikely that his parents would ever have met and married, except for events involved in World War I. Thus, without the evil that was the First World War, it is very unlikely that Adams would have been born. He continues,

How should I and others think and feel about the dependence of my existence on that great evil? Is it wrong for me to be glad that I exist? At least as important, is it wrong for anyone who loves me to be glad that I exist? That expresses the form of the problem of evil on which I want to reflect here. (2)

All things considered (including the First World War and the death, pain, and suffering caused by it), Adams believes that his existence and that of those whom he loves is a good thing and something that he ought not to wish had not occurred. Now, consider principle R*, which Adams endorses:

(R*) If a state of affairs q is a necessary condition for a state of affairs p, then if one does not (or ought not rationally to) wish, all things considered, that not-p, one ought not rationally to wish, all things considered, that not-q. (11)

Given R*, Adams concludes that to be glad all things considered about his existence and the existence of those whom he loves, while all things considered at the same time regretting the occurrence of the First World War (wishing that it had not occurred), would be to exhibit a form of emotional incoherence or apartheid. Nevertheless, because Adams believes that it is also fitting to feel some sort of localized regret about the occurrence of an evil like that of the First World War in itself, there is emotional space for ambivalence: "What love requires, I believe, is not complacency with whatever is or has been, but a sort of ambivalence" (6).

In his essay “Love and Emotional Reactions to Necessary Evils”, Thaddeus Metz points out that

Adams is not merely saying that supposing one is stuck with something bad, one should be glad that it was at least essential for something good that resulted from it, while wishing that it had not been the bad that was essential for it. Instead, the suggestion is that, if the bad is truly necessary for the good … , one has reason to be ‘unconditionally’ glad that the bad came about since only upon its presence could the good have come. (33)

Metz, though intrigued by Adams’ position, cannot endorse it. He wonders “whether, to be a loving person, one must have any emotional reaction at all towards what is known to be necessary for [that person] to exist” and argues “that a negative emotional reaction towards what is known to be necessary for a beloved to exist is compatible with loving [that person] and being glad that she exists” (41, 42). Metz argues against R* by counterexample: Suppose that a necessary condition of a person’s being alive is that she will have to die. As someone who loves his wife, Metz is glad about the bare fact that she exists and hates the fact that mortality is necessary for her existence. Hating this fact, however, does not entail that Metz fails to love his wife and that he wishes her not to exist.

Samantha Vice, in her chapter “The Virtues of the Useless: On Goodness, Evil and Beauty”, is broadly in agreement with Metz:

I cannot be ambivalent about the evils which are the necessary conditions for things and persons I love, … but must wholeheartedly consider them to be bad, just because they are not values [but disvalues]. And I can acknowledge their causal relation to things I value and love but feel no compulsion to come to an ‘all-things-considered’ view of the evil in its causal relation to a good outcome. It is terrible that a bad thing was the condition of a good thing; I admit the latter is good and it is not clear to me that I’m compelled to go further for the sake of emotional harmony or the protection of what I love. ‘If we adopted this alternative view’, Adams writes, ‘we would try to evaluate each event in itself, rejoicing and regretting without regard to the causal connections between the good and the evils’. This seems to me to be the best option. (169)

Metz and Vice believe that Adams is mistaken about the truth of R*. Another option is to accept R* but deny (sticking with Adams’ example) that the First World War is a necessary condition of his existence. Doing this would allow Adams to be glad about his existence all things considered while wishing all things considered that World War I had not occurred. Adams responds that

Even if it would have been metaphysically possible for us (precisely and individually us) to come into existence without the particular causal nexus from which we actually emerged, what reason is there to believe that we would have? (4)

One might respond that one does not know if there is any reason to believe that Adams would have come to exist within a different causal nexus, but add that one also does not know if there is any reason to believe that he would not have. Having said this, one could still affirm that one believes that the First World War is not a necessary condition of Adams’ existence. Given this is the case, one could affirm that a healthy emotional integration includes gladness about the good things that came out of the First World War, all the while wishing that it had never occurred.

Following Adams, we are glad about our existence. But there is more to us than our bare individual existence. What is this ‘more’ that makes us glad that we exist? The majority of the contributors to The Positive Function of Evil believe it is important kinds of ethical virtue and the opportunity to achieve them that is made possible by the occurrence of evil. For example, Tabensky in his essay “Shadows of Goodness” says in a Leibnizian spirit that

Perhaps we do live in something like the best of all possible worlds and this is a world in which good and evil, together, are constitutive of the space which allows the ethical properly to happen in the first place and, more generally, which allows us to live the sorts of lives that best fit the human constitution.

But there is something else that we must not fail to observe … . If [Leibniz] is half-right to believe that we live in the best of all possible worlds, then goodness requires evil … . My primary concern … is with the positive function of evil. What I want to show is that goodness would at best be severely limited were it not for the presence of evils that are, among other things, the excuses for being good … . The cost of eliminating evils from this world altogether, even terrible evils, is also too high if one assumes that moral blandness is utterly undesirable … . A world without moral heroes … would be a less than perfect world. Assuming that being moral is central to being the sorts of creatures that we ultimately want to be, we should not wish that all evil be eradicated. (54, 56, 57, 60, 63)

As a kindred spirit to Tabensky, Richard H. Bell in his “Moral Beauty Happens” approvingly quotes Philip Hallie’s statement that “moral beauty happens when someone carves out a place for compassion in a largely ruthless universe” and adds in his own words that “the genius of any robust goodness is that it is a response to the embedded ‘evils’ of life” (66). In an essay entitled “Murdochian Evil and Striving to be Good” on Iris Murdoch’s understanding of good and evil, Heather Widdows echoes Bell when she summarizes Murdoch’s moral vision as "the conviction that human being equates with moral being… . For Murdoch, … ‘morality must be fundamental in human life’" (83, 84). Though he does not agree that moral evil is necessary for a greater good that could not exist without it and believes that much moral evil has no positive function, John Kekes in his “The Moral Significance of Evil” nevertheless agrees with the other contributors who assume that "in its primary sense, evil is predicated of actions" (139). And in a Kekesian spirit, Vice asserts that “my starting point is that morality is profitably thought of as an instance of intrinsic value” (162).

Now it seems to me that all of these authors are mistaken in so far as they hold that action, and more specifically moral action, is a, if not the, primary locus of intrinsic value or disvalue. Rather, morality is fundamentally about not undermining but preserving and/or improving the well-being of others within the constraints imposed by the intrinsic good of justice, where this well-being is rightly thought to consist of the intrinsic good of pleasure/happiness. To back up my claim, I turn to one of the most engaging essays in the volume, Geoffrey Scarre’s "Wrong that is Right? The Paradox of the ‘Felix Culpa’". Scarre has us consider two cases where evil leads to good. The first is one where you are intending to cross a street on a cold winter night and slip on some ice and turn your ankle. Shortly thereafter, a passing car spins out of control and slides over the spot on the road where you would have been crossing had you not turned your ankle. The second case is one where you are a happy-go-lucky soul who hardly ever has a serious thought about anything. You fall on some ice, break your ankle, and are laid up for a month with your foot in a cast. This period of painful, forced inactivity leads you to have serious thoughts about patience, fortitude, and sympathy and leads you to become a more virtuous person. Unlike the first case, where the badness of the pain from your fall had nothing essential to do with the good result that occurred (had you paused to tie your shoelace before crossing the street, the same good effect would have occurred), the badness of the pain in the second case is non-contingently conceptually tied to the good results that follow.

Scarre points out that one of the most noted "cases of evils qua evils producing goods" is in the Christian tradition, where the happy fault of Adam’s original sin is a conceptually necessary condition of the good of Christ’s redemptive sacrifice (conceptually, there cannot be redemption without a wrong to be redeemed) (15). If ever there were a positive function of evil, this is it. In the words of St Paul, “‘where sin abounded, grace did much more abound’ (Rom.5:15-20; King James version). This plainly implies that the final state of the world is a much better one … than its state before the Fall” (17). Alvin Plantinga has recently embraced a Felix Culpa theodicy,1 but as I have argued elsewhere in response to him2 it is a serious mistake to claim (as Scarre does) that the redemptive sacrifice of Christ is the final state. While it is true that redemption is a matter of human beings being saved from the consequences of their sins, so also it is first and foremost a matter of human beings being saved for a final state that is the perfect happiness for which they were created. It is this perfect happiness (and any less than perfect happiness in this world that is a foretaste of that which is perfect) that is the fundamental locus of intrinsic goodness.

Scarre argues that because the gracious redemptive sacrifice of Christ is the final good state that requires as a necessary condition its obtaining the performance of evil actions, we seem to be left in the morally paradoxical situation of being encouraged to do evil that good might increase. Thus, "the moral paradox of the happy fault may reasonably make us wonder whether total consistency of ethical judgement is attainable even in principle" (14). If Christ’s redemptive act is the “final state of the world”, then it seems hard to avoid the paradox pointed out by Scarre (17). But if perfect happiness is the intended final state, then Scarre’s paradox does not arise.

In conclusion, though I disagree with how the authors of chapters in The Positive Function of Evil understand evil’s positive function, the book is a first-rate collection of thought-provoking essays on an important topic. As Tabensky says, though the book “is targeted primarily at professional philosophers and students of philosophy, [it] should have broad appeal. And it is written in a style that is accessible to the non-specialist” (xiv). Because of the book’s accessibility, I highly recommend it to anyone who is interested in reading and thinking about the relationship between evil and good in our world.3

1 Alvin Plantinga, “Supralapsarianism, or ‘O Felix Culpa’,” in Christian Faith and the Problem of Evil, edited by Peter van Inwagen (Grand Rapids, Mich: Eerdmans, 2004), pp. 1-25.

2 Stewart Goetz, Freedom, Teleology, and Evil (London: Continuum Press, 2008), Chapter 6.

3 Thanks to Kelly Sorensen for reading a rough draft of this review and making various helpful suggestions.