The Possibility of Christian Philosophy: Maurice Blondel at the Intersection of Theology and Philosophy

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Adam C. English, The Possibility of Christian Philosophy: Maurice Blondel at the Intersection of Theology and Philosophy, Routledge, 2007, 144pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415770415.

Reviewed by Oliva Blanchette, Boston College


Maurice Blondel was first and foremost a philosopher of religion. This is a status he had to establish for himself at the beginning of his career in an intellectual ambiance that was largely indifferent to questions of religion, at best, if not resolutely adamant against raising such questions in philosophy. He did this by successfully defending a thesis at the Sorbonne in 1893 on Action that concluded to the necessity of considering, not just religion in general, but one that is supernatural even from the standpoint of philosophy, before a jury that recognized the philosophical impact of his argument but still rejected its conclusion. It was a historic moment in the intellectual life of the time. The defense lasted five hours, before a packed auditorium, in which the young Catholic upstart with his new philosophical claims about religion took on the luminaries of the university on their own turf of philosophy.

Blondel won that first skirmish with the philosophers, but it was a battle he had to keep on fighting for the rest of his career, at the intersection of philosophy and theology, not just against resolutely irreligious philosophers, but also against religious authorities and thinkers who thought they could dictate to philosophy, without consideration for the autonomy of human reason and subjectivity. Blondel was indeed a thinker at the intersection of philosophy and religion, as the subtitle of this book suggests, and he kept himself rigorously at that intersection as a philosopher, arguing not so much for the possibility of Christian Philosophy, as the title of this book suggests, but rather for what he preferred to call Catholic Philosophy, flying in face of philosophers and theologians on both sides of the issue, those who were for the possibility of a Christian philosophy as well as those who were against in a debate he provoked when he wrote about St. Augustine as a continuing influence in philosophy in the early 1930's.

This book begins with a quick survey of how Blondel came to present himself as a Catholic philosopher of religion early in his career, but it says little precisely about how he actually established and defended his position and his method as a philosopher at the intersection of philosophy with religion in his dissertation on Action in 1893 and in the famous "Letter" he addressed to the Annales de Philosophie Chrétienne (APC) in 1896, in rebuttal to certain enthusiastic but misguided interpretations of his work by religious thinkers, the precise title of which was A Letter on the Requirements of Contemporary Thought and on Philosophical Method in the Study of the Religious Problem. Instead the book goes more directly to what it takes to be the fullest expression of Blondel's "Christian philosophy", the Trilogy on Thought (2 volumes), Being (1 volume), and Action (2 volumes), which came after the debate over the possibility of a Christian philosophy in the 1930's. It makes only a few passing references to a later work, entitled Philosophy and the Christian Spirit, where Blondel most explicitly placed himself at the intersection of philosophy and theology, or of reason and faith, in order to show how each learns from the other in the Christian dispensation of truth.

The book's connection with the "new theology" of the current Radical Orthodoxy movement is made explicit from the beginning as a particular lens through which Blondel's work is to be viewed, namely, as precursor to a certain kind of robust Christian theology facing up to the modern world and its consequent post-modern atheism and nihilism. "This study of Blondel hopes to provide fodder for the first two challenges" (5) of Radical Orthodoxy, we are told: (1) its diachronic insistence on "Christianity as it is actually lived and believed" (4) and (2) its practical willingness to cut across lines of demarcation in disciplines and institutions in putting pieces back together non-systematically or as "collage and bricolage" (4-5). Blondel did, of course, strive against dilettantism and nihilism at the beginning of his dissertation in 1893, but he spent much more time and energy constructing a "science of practice" to lead positively up to the question of true religion in the modern world, beginning with his dissertation on Action in 1893 and ending with the first two volumes of his Trilogy on Philosophy and the Christian Spirit published in 1944 and 1946, the 3rd volume of which was left unfinished at the time of his death in 1949.

The book is relatively short for one that purportedly explores the entire body of Blondel's work as it relates "to the debates surrounding the radical orthodoxy identity", or more generally to the "possibility of a Christian Philosophy". After a brief introduction in which the idea of a Christian Philosophy is laid out in accordance with what is called radical orthodoxy, chapter 2 surveys Blondel's early works in which he is supposed to have first presented his idea of Christian philosophy. This is followed by three more chapters organized around the different parts of Blondel's Trilogy of the 1930's.

In the introduction, "Christian philosophy" is characterized as distinctive in style and content, in that it is orchestrated by the ideas of creation, redemption, and eschatology. This does not mean that the Christian story provides the subject for Christian philosophy, as it does for theology, but rather that it provides "the compass or the grid for using reason and reflecting on existence" (2). At the same time, however, it is also said, somewhat bewilderingly, that the possibility of such a philosophy "comes as a Christian virtue, that of hope", and that it is "already a theological discipline … a humble hope of participation in truth -- reason seeking faith" (2), as if faith were a presupposition for "Christian philosophy" in the same way that it is a presupposition for Christian theology. It is the possibility of such a project that is said to have ignited Blondel's long career as a philosopher.

The second chapter tries to tell something of how Blondel came to such a career through a dissertation on Action, an unwonted subject for philosophy at the time, and through a long discourse on philosophical method three years later, in the Lettre of 1896, in which he took issue with religious thinkers, mainly Catholic and Thomist, who were misreading his "apologetics" for religion and turning it into a theology or a distorted psychology. The book only skims through these two major systematic works in which Blondel poured out his soul as a philosopher in opposition to what he considered both bad philosophy and bad theology. The book latches onto a collage of catch phrases that does not go to the heart of the problem of religion as Blondel understood it. It goes on to mention some other publications of Blondel's during these times of heated debate over Modernism, before coming to the long published interview of 1928, in which Blondel reviewed his Philosophical Itinerary, as he was coming to the end of his teaching career, and then gave indications of the sort of Trilogy he was heading for as a philosopher.

The chapter on Thought is entitled "Structure", to indicate what the author wants to get out of this 2-volume work. "By thought," he writes, "Blondel means intentional, purposeful structure" (31). Thought is what structures the universe, "and in this way, it is a first grace" (33). Blondel would not entirely disagree with this, but it is not exactly what he had in mind as his subject when he wrote about Thought, as notional and real, as noetic and pneumatic, and as pensée pensante and pensée pensée, all of which have to do with keeping cosmic, organic and human thought open to another kind of Thinking or Thought, one that is pure Thought and pure Thinking all at once and without interruption, at the origin of all finite thinking. It is within the context of this chapter on "Structure" that the book first brings up for discussion the distinction between nature and supernature, which had been for Blondel the central philosophical problem in both the dissertation of 1893 and the Letter of 1896. Here, however, it is discussed in terms of what the new theologians, especially de Lubac, made of this distinction and of the "natural desire to see God" implied in it for human existence.

The chapter on Being as part of the Trilogy is entitled "Mystery". It pulls Blondel one step further into theology by using the idea of Creation as a theological term, or as a "mystery" that, in Blondel's own words, quoted at the head of the chapter from the later work on Philosophy and the Christian Spirit, "is impenetrable to the human spirit", in relation to what we otherwise know as Being and beings, which remains the subject for this second part of the Trilogy, even with regard to Being in and for Itself. "The grammar of creation," according to the author here, "takes Blondel's theological ontology beyond being inasmuch as it does not grant 'being' the status of metaphysical mediator between Creator and his ex nihilo creation. Instead creation mediates being" (54), much as it does for a theologian in a "theological route to being" now proposed as a "philosophical way of descent from God".

To justify this bold assertion, which Blondel never made, and the idea of Christian philosophy it presupposes, the chapter conjures up, mostly from commentators on Blondel, the idea of a "Blondelian proof" that leads (1) from "the possibility of conceiving a truly absolute Being", (2) to affirming an absolute Being, (3) to end with "the possibility of a Christian conception of 'absolute, perfect Being'" (56). The chapter tries to bring in the Christian idea of mystery, including that associated with "creation", down into reason itself and presents what is spoken of as a matter of revelation as if it were a matter of truth penetrable by reason. Everything that is a problem for reason to explore, including the idea of creation or of Creator, is turned into a mystery, which only faith can affirm on the basis of a revelation, and then represented as a philosophy from on high, or rather as theology. The grammar of being, which Blondel used in l'Être et les êtres, is transformed into a grammar of creation, which suits theology very well, but remains enigmatic for philosophy, as Blondel says in the grammar of his distinction between philosophical enigma and Christian mystery elaborated in his later work on Philosophy and the Christian Spirit. It is no wonder then that the chapter goes on to discuss different theological trajectories in Catholic thought alleged to be extensions of Blondel's thought, but that Blondel never went along with, since it meant confusing philosophy with theology all over again and essentially leaving behind the philosophical task he had set for himself.

The final chapter of the book, on Action as the third part of Blondel's Trilogy, is entitled "Power", in keeping with an idea of possibility supposedly at stake in this study. "This chapter will introduce power as the third frame of the triptych" (79). It is supposed that "power" is what comes to mind when one reads action, and from that the chapter goes on to discuss power in three dimensions: power humanized, power socialized, and power activated as the webbing of divine action. After a few indications of how the new 2-volume format of L'Action relates to the earlier version of 1893 and to the rest of the Trilogy, the chapter goes on to speak of human action abstractly as "power humanized", in keeping with a distinction Blondel makes between making or poiein, practicing or prattein, and contemplating or theorein. Concerning "power socialized", the chapter brings out the social structure of human action, "in association with God and with one another" and as oriented by "the structure, mystery, and power of creation" (88) toward peace and civilization in the world, without mention of anything about the supernatural end of the human being in action that Blondel leads up to in the 2nd volume of this later version of Action, no less than he had done in the earlier version. With regard to "power activated" the book falls back into a grammar of creation under the guise of "pure action" in God as the source and mediator of all being, which can take the form of "panchristicism", a theme that Blondel did strike in some of his earlier writings but did not return to in his later writings.

On the whole, the book gives a good account of why Radical Orthodoxy, which seems to be theology more than philosophy, should be more interested in Blondel than in other modern or post-modern philosophers or social scientists. It shows quite rightly how Blondel took his stand at the same intersection of philosophy and religion in the question of human life and action as a whole, as Radical Orthodoxy does, where philosophy and theology should not be kept separate from one another. Blondel argued against the separation of philosophy from religion in modern thought all his life or, to put it the other way around, he argued for the necessity of raising the question of supernatural religion in philosophy. But he did this from within philosophy, according to a "method of immanence", as he called it in his early writings and again in the notes for his third volume on Philosophy and the Christian Spirit at the end of his life, and not from within religion or the Christian narrative, a discourse that descends from God to human reason as mystery.

Blondel always maintained a distinction of strict heterogeneity of discourse between faith and theology, on the one hand, and reason and philosophy, on the other, a distinction without confusion of the one with the other, in accordance with a radical orthodoxy in both theology and philosophy. That is why he could not settle for the terms "Christian philosophy" as an expression for what he was about. He preferred to talk about "Catholic philosophy" in both the universal sense of the term kath'ollou and the proper sense of the Catholic teaching concerning the supernatural, in order to avoid confusion and to maintain a distinction between philosophical enigma and Christian mystery, while bringing them together to show how the impenetrable Christian mysteries brought new light into the enigmas of philosophy as seen in Thought, Being and Action.

Blondel did not argue strictly for the supernatural as a possibility, whether in God or in what God does in the world as incarnate Word, as this book seems to suggest. In L'Action of 1893 he says that knowing the possibility of something implies that we know what it is or what it does in its own way, whereas, as he pointed out in the Lettre of 1896, philosophy can only affirm the supernatural as unknowable to mere reason. In arguing for the supernatural as a necessary hypothesis, he was not presuming to know anything of what that hypothesis might entail in actuality. He was only saying that the hypothesis is necessary, if there is going to be mediation for making the human will equal to itself in action. And he did this, not by belittling philosophy, reason or the human will, as this book and some other Christian philosophers or theologians are prone to do, but by raising reason and philosophy of action up to the fullness of its responsibility, to a systematic openness, not to some sort of natural theology, which for him still smacked too much of superstition, but to the mystery of the supernatural as an answer to the enigmas that remain after philosophy has run its course.

This book makes a lot of the theology that has been inspired by Blondel's philosophy of religion as supernatural. But such theology, even concerning the supernatural as such, is not what he had in mind in his philosophy of religion. Changing his philosophy into a theology tends to obscure "the precise philosophical point in the religious problem and the appropriate method for getting to it", as he put it in the central part of his Lettre of 1896. Blondel always resisted attempts to draw him into theology, even those of sympathetic readers like de Lubac and Bouillard or the earlier reviewers at the APC. Not everyone agrees that Blondel could be drawn into theology in the way these French Jesuits have done. This book lists Henry Duméry in the bibliography, but it does not cite any of his work in opposition to the theological stamp Bouillard was giving to Blondel's work, while belittling its philosophical import. Blondel was on Duméry's side in this controversy that was going on while he was trying to finish his own work on Philosophy and the Christian Spirit, a title carefully chosen to avoid any semblance of theology or of confused and confusing bricolage in "Christian philosophy".

Whether Blondel's philosophy of religion, even of supernatural religion, can fit into the project of Radical Orthodoxy as defined in this book is highly dubious. One suspects that Blondel probably would have risen up against the inflection given to his thought here, much as he did against the reviewers of the APC in 1896. Nevertheless, the attempt to tie Blondel into the project of Radical Orthodoxy is significant. It shows a convergence of interest between Radical Theology and Blondel for taking a stand at the intersection of theology and philosophy in assessing the human condition in its historical actuality. A closer look at how Blondel actually executed his project in L'Action (1893) and in his final work on Philosophy and the Christian Spirit, however, could help to clarify how Radical Orthodoxy might more properly conceive its own project, as one in theology or as one in philosophy, or even as both, but not at the same time or as a hapless collage or bricolage of the two. It cannot be both at the same time without confusing two heterogeneous kinds of discourse and, Blondel might add, without verging into a post-modern sort of superstition, or making an idol of God in the practice of one's religion, which would be to the detriment of both faith and reason.

It is important to keep in mind that Blondel gets to his positive philosophy of the supernatural only through a critique of superstition in all its forms, including that of modern "natural theology" which had become a hallmark of modern Thomism. Blondel always thought that there was much more to Christian theology or to the Christian narrative than anything purely natural or accessible to the investigation of reason, as did St. Thomas, and he set out to prove that it had to be so as a philosopher, not as a theologian. Only the last word in Action (1893) is a word of faith: c'est, which is not a conclusion, but an attestation concerning the Christian narrative of a certitude that cannot be communicated "because it arises only from the intimacy of a totally personal action", an act of faith. All the rest is philosophy, including the discourse on the necessary hypothesis of the supernatural.