The Possibility of Inquiry: Meno's Paradox from Socrates to Sextus

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Gail Fine, The Possibility of Inquiry: Meno's Paradox from Socrates to Sextus, Oxford University Press, 2014, 399pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199577392.

Reviewed by Whitney Schwab, University of Maryland, Baltimore County


Gail Fine’s philosophical and scholarly rigor are on full display in this work. As its title indicates, it is a comprehensive examination of philosophical engagement with Meno’s Paradox in antiquity. Although the treatments of the Paradox that Fine considers have all received at least some attention (with Plato’s receiving by far the most), her work is the first to consider them side-by-side. The result is an important examination according to which “the agreements [among the various treatments of the paradox] might impress us more than the disagreements” (368).

Part 1, which occupies almost half the work (Chs. 2-5), focuses on Plato’s Meno. Although readers will not find any significant departures from the positions Fine advances elsewhere,1 they will find those positions more fully elucidated and defended.

After Meno’s repeated failure to specify the nature of virtue in the initial stages of his eponymous dialogue, he raises the following questions:

(M1) And how will you inquire into this, Socrates, when you don’t at all know what it is? (M2) For what sort of thing, from among those you don’t know, will you put forward as the thing you’re inquiring into? (M3) And even if you really encounter it, how will you know that this is the thing you didn’t know? (80d5-8).2

Socrates immediately reformulates Meno’s questions as a dilemma:

Do you see what an eristic argument you’re introducing, (S4) that it’s not possible for someone to inquire either into that which he knows or into that which he doesn’t know? For, (S2) he wouldn’t inquire into that which he knows (for he knows it, and there is no need for such a person to inquire); nor (S3) into that which he doesn’t know (for he doesn’t even know what he’ll inquire into). (80e1-5)

For Fine, “Meno’s Paradox” refers to the conjunction of Meno’s questions and Socrates’ dilemma, but also, more broadly, to “arguments that challenge the possibility of inquiry by focusing on questions about knowing and not knowing” (27). This broader use is important, since several of the thinkers she considers neither reconstruct Meno’s Paradox nor refer to the Meno. I return to this issue later.

According to Fine, Meno and Socrates have quite different understandings of the force of the Paradox. Meno, she claims, raises two related objections. M2 raises the “Targeting Objection”, according to which “one can’t inquire into something if one doesn’t at all know what it is since, in that case, one won’t have a target to aim at” (75). M3 raises the “Recognition Objection”, according to which “if one doesn’t antecedently know the thing one is inquiring into, one won’t be able to know, or realize, one has found it if one manages to do so” (80). Fine takes these two objections to be cogent if “not knowing” is understood as being in a “cognitive blank” about something (this is also how she thinks Meno understands Socrates’ S3). If, for example, I am in a cognitive blank about where my friend lives, where this even includes having no information about how I could find out, it would seem that I cannot set out on the kind of systematic investigation characteristic of inquiry. Moreover, even if I somehow happened to come across my friend’s house in the course of a haphazard wandering, I would have no way of recognizing it as such. Thus, Meno’s worry, Fine thinks, is warranted if the alternative to knowing something is being in a cognitive blank about it.

However, as Fine thinks is obvious, there are cognitive states that fall short of knowledge but do not constitute being in a cognitive blank. This is certainly true on Plato’s conception of knowledge as “true belief that is tied down with reasoning about the explanation” (Fine calls this “P-knowledge”) (16). Thus, according to Fine, Meno’s “mistake” is failing to realize that lacking P-knowledge “doesn’t imply that one is in a complete cognitive blank. There are also true beliefs, and roughly-accurate beliefs” (82; cf. 103). In other words, Meno’s failure lies in not recognizing that there are distinctions among cognitive states above the level of being in a cognitive blank.

In Chs. 4-5 Fine argues that not only is this the way someone should respond to Meno’s Paradox, it is also Plato’s response. The central upshot of the discussion between Socrates and Meno’s slave, she takes it, is that someone without knowledge can, nevertheless, inquire, so long as that person has and relies on relevant true beliefs (e.g., in the slave’s case, that a square has four equal sides). Thus, Fine thinks that Plato avoids the conclusion of Meno’s Paradox by rejecting S3, since he thinks true belief, while not sufficient for knowledge, is sufficient for inquiry.3

Fine’s interpretation gives Plato a neat and tidy response to Meno’s Paradox. However, it might seem odd that a philosophical puzzle that exercised some of the greatest thinkers of antiquity could be answered merely by pointing to the fact that there are true beliefs that don’t count as P-knowledge. It is true that Socrates is in dialogue with Meno, and Meno is no philosopher (for example, Socrates earlier had to point out the difference between saying “justice is virtue” and “justice is a virtue” (73d9-e1)). However, there is strong reason to think that Meno was committed to a difference between what he thought of as knowledge and true belief before his interaction with Socrates. When Socrates uses the example of the “Road to Larissa” to suggest that true belief is as effective a guide to action as knowledge, Meno is led to wonder “why knowledge is prized far more highly than correct belief, and on account of what the one differs from the other” (97d1-3, my translation). Meno here suggests that Socrates’ example has cast doubt on a view he previously held (and, indeed, one he thinks is commonly held). So, while Fine may be right that Meno did not antecedently conceive of all knowledge as P-knowledge, it seems that he did antecedently distinguish among cognitive conditions above the level of being in a cognitive blank. The idea that Plato’s response to the Paradox consists principally in maintaining that there is such a distinction, then, is suspect.

Putting aside that worry, Fine goes on to argue that Plato posits recollection as the best explanation of how we can successfully inquire but that “Plato doesn’t spell out the details of how recollection plays this explanatory role” (165, emphasis original). Perhaps most controversially, Fine argues that Plato’s appeal to recollection does not involve a commitment to innatism about knowledge (or beliefs or concepts), in either the “cognitive-condition” sense (i.e., from birth we are in the cognitive condition of knowing) or the “content” sense (i.e., from birth our souls contain contents that can serve as the contents of knowledge, but are not present from birth as knowledge) (140-47).4 Rather, Fine argues that Plato posits only prenatal knowledge. Upon being born we completely lose this prenatal knowledge, so that it is not in any sense true to say that the slave, for example, possessed any knowledge at the time he began conversing with Socrates. Thus, Fine thinks, however exactly Plato conceives of recollection as explaining our ability to inquire successfully, it is not by causing us to come to stand in a different relationship to knowledge we already, in some sense, possess (e.g., by making “latent” knowledge “explicit”).

To defend this position, Fine appropriately engages in a close reading of the passage that immediately follows the slave’s acquisition of the correct geometrical belief (147-65). She ingeniously deflects some of the more troubling aspects for her interpretation (including motivating what initially struck me as a non-starter, namely that Socrates’ suggestion that the slave might have “always had knowledge” (85d9-10) could possibly mean only that the slave had knowledge “for the whole of his prior existence (until he forgot it)” (154)).

However, I do not think that Fine adequately addresses the strongest piece of evidence for the innatist reading. The key lines are these:

Soc.: Won’t he know without having been taught by anyone, but <only by> being questioned, taking up (analabôn) the knowledge himself from himself? — Yes.

In arguing that this passage does not commit Plato to innatism, Fine points out that the verb “analambanein” can mean “to take up” in a sense that does not entail that what is taken up has been taken up before (150-51). (Indeed, this is true of the English verb “retake”: a displaced native people can retake their homeland even if they did not take it for a first time.) However, Socrates doesn’t just say that the slave will take up knowledge but that he will do so himself from himself (autos ex hautou). Fine only addresses this phrase in a footnote, saying that she takes it to mean “that the slave himself works things out by, or for, himself” (151, fn. 43). Fine, however, does not justify this reading, either by explaining how it could mean that or pointing to other passages in Plato where it does mean that (in 148, fn. 38 she cites an occurrence of the phrase “ex hautou” in Aristotle’s De Memoria, but does not elaborate on what that phrase means there, nor how it relates to Plato’s phrase). We need some justification for Fine’s reading, however, since it is hard to imagine a more misleading way Plato could have put that point. He could have made it clear by putting “himself” in the dative (as he does, for example, in referring to the soul figuring things out with no sensory input at Phaedo, 66e1 (cf. Gorgias, 523e3)), or by using the phrase “through himself” (as he does, again in reference to the soul, at Theaetetus, 185e1).

Moreover, there are passages in which Plato uses the verb “lambanein” (which has the same force as the verb “analambanein” as Fine understands it here) with “ex” + a genitive and a noun in the accusative. And, in those contexts, the thing that is taken from something is present in that thing in the form in which it is taken. In the Phaedrus, for example, Socrates maintains that some human beings “as they are in touch with the god [sc. Zeus] by memory they are inspired by him and take up from him his customs and practices (ex ekeinou lambanousi ta ethê kai ta epitêdeumata)” (253a2-4, trans. adapted from Nehamas and Woodruff). It is clear here that the customs and practices that human beings take up from Zeus are already present in Zeus. Fine needs to do more, then, to explain why Socrates’ claim that the slave will take up knowledge himself from himself should not be taken to entail that the knowledge is in some sense already present in the slave, waiting to be taken up.

I have focused extensively on Part 1 because it “develops many of the main issues” (3) discussed in Part 2, which devotes a chapter each to Aristotle (Ch. 6), the Epicureans (Ch. 7), the Stoics (Ch. 8), and Plutarch (Ch. 9), and two chapters to Sextus Empiricus (Chs. 10-11). Indeed, Fine’s discussion in Part 2 feels somewhat mechanical at times. Having isolated what she takes to be the core issue of Meno’s Paradox, she identifies what each thinker or school posits as necessary for the possibility of inquiry and then asks what she calls three “familiar questions”: what kind of cognitive condition are they claiming is necessary for inquiry?, what content does it require?, and, is it innate or acquired via experience? (adapted from 228). As a result, we gain good insight into how each thinker conceives of the conditions for inquiry, but, as I suggest below, questions arise as to whether evaluating them as responding to Meno’s Paradox is somewhat unnatural.

Aristotle does explicitly mention the Meno and presents something with at least some resemblance to Meno’s Paradox. He begins the Posterior Analytics by maintaining that “All teaching and intellectual learning come from prior gnôsis” (71a1-2). While this might seem an explicit statement that inquiry requires knowledge, as Fine notes it would be too quick to take Aristotle to be going against her interpretation of Plato. Even if Aristotle uses the word “gnôsis” to denote what he takes to be knowledge, this does not entail that Aristotle is here claiming that knowledge, in the sense of P-knowledge, is required for inquiry (which is all Fine thinks Plato denies). Fine argues, convincingly, that Aristotle’s use of the term is meant to include cognitive states that Plato would have counted as mere true belief. Likewise, Fine thinks that Aristotle agrees with Plato that human beings do not have innate knowledge, in any robust sense of that notion, though he disagrees with Plato in that he does not take us to have prenatal knowledge.

When Fine turns to the Epicureans and the Stoics, she encounters the first thinkers who do not explicitly mention Meno’s Paradox or the Meno. However, she focuses on the fact that both schools posit prolepsis as necessary for inquiry and Plutarch’s claim that they did so to explain “the possibility of inquiry” (300) to justify treating prolepsis as their orthodox response to Meno’s Paradox. She then argues, again convincingly, that for neither school does prolepsis amount to a cognitive condition that Plato would think of as amounting to more than mere true belief and that neither school posits prolepseis as innate, at least not in the main.

Although we do gain genuine insight into the ways in which these schools conceive of prolepsis and its role in inquiry, the motivation for claiming that they posit prolepsis as a way of solving Meno’s Paradox is somewhat suspect. I focus on the case of Epicurus. Fine herself took the “broader” notion of Meno’s Paradox to involve not just a concern for the possibility of inquiry, but specifically a concern for it motivated by “questions about knowing and not knowing” (27). A central piece of evidence that Fine cites to defend the idea that Epicurus posited prolepsis to respond to Meno’s Paradox in this sense comes in his Letter to Herodotus:

First, then, Herodotus, we must grasp the things which underlie words, so that we may have them as a reference point against which to judge matters of belief, inquiry, and puzzlement, and not have everything undiscriminated for ourselves as we attempt infinite chains of proof, or have words which are empty. For the primary concept corresponding to each word must be seen and need no additional proof, if we are going to have a reference point for matters of inquiry, puzzlement, and belief. (Hdt. 37-8 = LS 17C)

According to Fine, “In saying that we need a ‘reference point for matters of inquiry’, Epicurus adverts to the Targeting Objection” (226). However, this is not obvious. Rather than alluding to some worry about whether, without knowledge, we can set an appropriate target, he seems to be saying that we must have some standard against which to adjudicate the things we come across in inquiry. To say this, however, is not to say that prolepsis responds to a concern about the possibility of inquiry motivated by questions of knowing and not knowing. Rather, it may be an exhortation in line with the commonplace that philosophers should be clear on the meanings of their terms before they embark on inquiry, which is a concern often associated with Socrates and not in the context of Meno’s Paradox. (Epictetus, for example, attributes to Socrates the view that examination of names (episkepsis tôn onomatôn) is the starting point of education (archê paideuseôs) (Discourses 1.17.12)). This does not entail that Fine’s ensuing discussion of Epicurean prolepsis and the role it plays in inquiry is not interesting and valuable. It does, however, raise worries about whether the issues are being cast in a genuinely Epicurean context.

Although I have pointed to what I take to be some troubles in Fine’s discussion, this book contains many more strengths than weaknesses. Regardless of whether one agrees with all the details, Fine clearly shows what is at stake and what distinctions must be borne in mind to understand these issues. The book will undoubtedly become an indispensable touchstone for any future thinker who wishes to discuss the problems for the possibility of inquiry first raised in Plato’s Meno.5

1 See, especially, her ‘Inquiry in the Meno’, in R. Kraut (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Plato, Cambridge (1992) and ‘Enquiry and Discovery: A Discussion of Dominic Scott, Plato’s Meno’ in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 32 (2007), 331-67.

2 Unless noted, all translations and editorial insertions are Fine’s.

3 She also maintains that Plato thinks, but does not argue, that S2 is false (135).

4 Fine also considers “dispositional innatism”, according to which from birth we are disposed to acquire knowledge, but she seems most concerned to argue that Plato does not commit himself to either cognitive-condition or content innatism.

5 Thanks to David Bronstein, Errol Lord, Benjamin Morison, and Jessica Moss for helpful discussion and comments.