The Possibility of Philosophical Understanding: Reflections on the Thought of Barry Stroud

Placeholder book cover

Jason Bridges, Niko Kolodny, and Wai-Hung Wong (eds.), The Possibility of Philosophical Understanding: Reflections on the Thought of Barry Stroud, Oxford University Press, 2011, 300pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195381658.

Reviewed by Richard Fumerton, University of Iowa


This is a wonderful collection of papers on the important and influential thought of Barry Stroud. While Stroud will probably always be best known for his appreciation of the significance of skeptical arguments, he has written on a wide range of topics, and the authors in this collection advance discussion on many of the diverse issues raised in Stroud's work. Don Garrett has a penetrating piece comparing his thought to Stroud's on the interpretation of Hume's cryptic "second thoughts" about personal identity. Michael Williams, Robert Fogelin, Ernie Sosa, Jonathan Ellis and Wai-hung Wong also enter the lists against either the skeptic or Stroud's own attempts to offer transcendental responses to the skeptic. There are two papers, one by Hannah Ginsborg, the other by Jason Bridges, related to Stroud's views about meaning and the way in which mental states figure into rational explanations of action. John McDowell and John Campbell have interesting papers critically examining Stroud's views about color beliefs (as presented in The Quest for Reality), and those papers are followed by an exceptionally clear and well-argued paper by Sarah Stroud on Barry Stroud's rejection of subjectivist views about value. The volume closes with a subtle and original paper by Cheryl Chen on complex issues related to our conception of time.

It is always difficult to review a collection of papers on a philosopher's work, particularly a collection of papers this rich in controversial philosophical thought. I'll begin by apologizing to those whose work I don't discuss in the following remarks. The reasons for my focus are primarily related to my own philosophical background with respect to research and interest. I should start, however, by complimenting the editors on a most informative introduction. Reading that introduction gives a real feel for the intricacies and subtleties of Stroud's thought. As I noted earlier, Stroud is probably most closely associated with a kind of sympathy for skepticism, but the editors remind us that Stroud is not a skeptic. Indeed, he attempts to find ways of responding to, or at least blunting the force of, the skeptic's attack. Above all, though, Stroud is committed to taking the skeptic's arguments seriously. He rejects "easy" externalist solutions to the challenge of skepticism, solutions that strike some of us as an effort to simply change the philosophically interesting questions with which the skeptic was grappling.

I share Stroud's fascination with the skeptic's challenge, but I'm not at all convinced that one can enter into the skeptic's framework, grant the skeptic's epistemological presuppositions, and successfully escape back to the world of commonsense. Descartes wasn't the first, and won't be the last, epistemologist, to mistakenly believe that he could play by the skeptic's rules and still win the game. A great many epistemologists who are absolutely committed from the outset to avoiding skepticism are, understandably then, determined to expose the "unfair" rules upon which the skeptic insists. The most serious and global skeptical challenge is one Stroud eloquently describes in some of his earliest work. There he takes the skeptic as wanting an argument for thinking that the sources of our beliefs are legitimate, an argument that does not itself presuppose the legitimacy of any of those sources of belief. That skeptic, one might well argue, is bound for disappointment.

The challenge when clearly understood reveals that it can't be met. As soon as I try to formulate a premise it should dawn on me that I just implicitly assumed the legitimacy of using some way of arriving at that truth. Plantinga once told me that God himself couldn't know anything if He first had to step outside of all ways He had of arriving at the truth and certify the legitimacy of these ways of arriving at the truth from that external "neutral" position. But most skeptical arguments in the history of philosophy are not that global in their attack. In arguing for skepticism about the external world, for example, most skeptics took for granted that they had all sorts of other knowledge -- knowledge of the self and its ideas and experiences, knowledge of the legitimacy of certain sorts of inference, knowledge of past experience, and so on. But even here, philosophers often claim that the skeptics have tilted the philosophical playing field.

In his piece, for example, Michael Williams expands upon themes familiar from his other work in arguing against the external-world skeptic's insistence that our foundational evidence is restricted to the world of appearance. Williams's contextualism insists that in a given context we can just as legitimately "start" with commonplace beliefs about the external world as the evidence at our disposal in responding to a given epistemological challenge. The history of this discussion is long and complex, and I won't try to elaborate on my reasons for embracing the far more radical empiricist's thesis that there is a world of appearance to which we have a more direct and better access, and that is more properly thought of as basic.

The argument that is most telling for that view is, I believe, the old argument from the possibility of hallucination. According to that argument there is something common to both vivid hallucination and veridical experience -- something that can give us precisely the same justification in both situations for believing what we do about our physical environment. We need a language to describe that common denominator and many philosophers prefer the language of appearance. In both the good and bad cases it appears as if such and such were the case. The truth about appearance is more secure than any belief about the physical world prompted by such experience precisely because whether or not the appearance is veridical or hallucinatory we are not wrong about the instrinsic character of the appearance. When we make a claim about the physical world we stick our necks out further -- we go beyond what we know about the way things look. These days, of course, one can't get away with saying just this -- there are too many important alternatives that need to be discussed -- but I thought it might be useful to put some cards on the table. Interestingly enough, it is not clear that the later Stroud himself can embrace an argument as straightforward as the one presented above, and I'll have more to say about this shortly.

After Sosa summarizes his now familiar distinction between animal and reflective knowledge, he reminds us of his view that we will reach the more satisfying reflective knowledge only by noticing appropriate coherence among our beliefs. I have expressed reservations elsewhere about coherence as the road to philosophical assurance, but toward the end of his contribution Sosa seems to express some solidarity with Stroud's transcendental approach to dealing with skepticism. He considers the philosopher worrying about a skeptical scenario in which one has been administered a cognitively disabling pill (Disablex) that renders virtually all of one's cognitive processes defective. While the hypothesis seems to me coherent, Sosa argues that one could never embrace the hypothesis at the reflective level. Sosa argues that embracing the hypothesis, or even attempting to remain neutral with respect to its truth, would introduce into one's belief system a kind of incoherence that would preclude one's having any justified beliefs, including even the skeptical conclusion. But even if all this were true, it is not clear to me why that entitles one to reject the skeptical scenario. Philosophers want satisfying justification and, to be sure, they are not going to get it without having justified belief in the rejection of skeptical scenarios, but philosophy is not a Hobbesian state of nature. One can't just help oneself to what one needs in order to get what one wants. Just as the apparent memory of someone in the devastating later stages of Alzheimer's can turn on itself, so reason more generally can turn on itself, leaving oneself with no place to comfortably settle.

Ellis discusses more directly Stroud's flirtations with transcendental responses to the skeptic. He attributes to Stroud the Davidsonian idea that one can never be in a position to attribute beliefs to others without presupposing that what others believe is largely true. Trying to get oneself into a position where one can take seriously the skeptic's position will inevitably fail because one won't from that position even be able to make sense of the skeptic's beliefs. Ellis's discussion of Stroud is important because it does underscore potential tensions in Stroud's own approach to the skeptic. On one classic way of understanding the skeptic's challenge, we approach the problem from what one might call the egocentric perspective (we approach the problem from the inside out, so to speak). We've got this secure (or at least relatively secure) knowledge of our inner mental life and are trying to move beyond it to the world of objects and their properties whose existence is independent of our mental states. But in passages Ellis quotes, Stroud does seem unequivocally to reject this way of thinking about how we can rationally ascribe beliefs to others. Stroud's apparent rejection of content internalism also surfaces in McDowell's and Campbell's discussions of his views about how to understand ascriptions of color to objects (and in particular his rejection of traditional secondary-quality analyses of such color ascriptions). There too Stroud seems uneasy with the old-fashioned empiricism that introduces expressions like "phenomenal red" or "being appeared to red-ly" to characterize an experience as it is intrinsically whatever its external cause might be. The issue might seem to be critical not only for the reductionist's program, but also for the classical skeptic's attempt to generate an epistemological puzzle about moving from appearance to reality.

Consider the debate that arose years ago when Sellars tried to throw a monkey wrench into the radical empiricists' approach to puzzles of perception by claiming that the philosopher's use of "appears" has essentially only two plausible interpretations. On the first, to say of something that it appears to be such and such is just to express tentative belief. The second use of "appears" functions to draw a comparison between the experience we are having now and some paradigmatic veridical experience. So, for example, to say that X appears red is just to say that X appears the way red things do under such and such conditions. At the time epistemic conservatism wasn't taken seriously, and Sellars thought it obvious that neither of these two sorts of truths about appearances would do one any good in trying to find that "secure" foundation from which we could begin to reason about the physical world. Nor could we hope to reduce talk about the color of physical objects to appearance talk when our understanding of the comparative appearance talk is so obviously parasitic upon prior understanding of color ascriptions to physical objects. In Quest, Stroud seems to be moving in a Sellarsian direction.

But I always thought Chisholm won the debate with Sellars about these matters. Put crudely, Chisholm thought it obvious that the comparative use of appears itself introduces the idea that there is some way that the red things look, and you can't stop a philosopher from introducing a technical expression to describe the intrinsic nature of that way of appearing (Chisholm just used "appears" in what he coined its noncomparative sense). If Chisholm was right, the radical empiricist has found his more secure foundation for belief about the external world, and has also found at least some materials out of which one could go about building an analysis of secondary properties as powers to affect sentient beings in certain ways. To be sure, these translations are not unproblematic, and Stroud raises the worry that it is obviously only a contingent fact that red things look red under standard conditions -- all that could change. And there we do have a fundamental dispute between the old secondary quality theorist and Stroud. I'm not sure a classic secondary quality theorist would allow that it is conceivable that people live in a world in which red things never look red and sour things never taste sour.

Transcendental arguments of the sort Stroud explores all rely on premises that one should reject from the egocentric perspective. One doesn't need to believe anything about an external world, or about other minds, in order to have a healthy array of beliefs about one's internal mental life. One doesn't need to ascribe properties of any sort to any existing physical objects in order to wonder whether or not such objects exist. One doesn't need even the concept of red as a property of physical objects to have the concept of a certain kind of visual experience, an experience whose nature is in constant flux even if there are more stable causal powers residing in an external world. One certainly doesn't need to think about the beliefs of others to raise skeptical worries. There is nothing incoherent about solipsism. It isn't impossible to have a private language nor, even more obviously, is it impossible to have a solitary linguist. A solipsist can entertain all of the same fundamental skeptical scenarios that anyone else can entertain, and a solipsist can while away his lonely years working on the same reductions that the radical empiricist hoped would blaze an easier inferential path from phenomenal foundations to beliefs that move beyond those foundations.

It always puzzled me that in his early work Stroud didn't seem that interested in the possibility of reduction as a way out of skeptical dilemmas. To be sure, one isn't going to reduce talk of the past to talk of the present (even the very young Ayer gave that up quickly). But trying to understand at least some talk of a mind-independent world in terms of its power to affect subjective experience seems much more promising. Such reductionist programs do need a way of understanding and talking about subjective experience that isn't parasitic upon our understanding of the mind-independent. And Stroud's sympathy for transcendental arguments is probably what prevents him from going down that road.

As Sarah Stroud's discussion makes clear, Barry Stroud's reasons for rejecting certain reductionist views about value are in the end closely related to his reasons for rejecting translations of external world talk into talk of subjective sensations. As Sarah Stroud argues, Barry Stroud, like Moore before him, is probably not sanguine about the idea that there is such a thing as subjectively valuing something (where that valuing is an irreducible intentional state). Like Moore, Barry Stroud might think that valuing or approving of some state of affairs just is judging it to be good. And if that were so, then it would be folly to try to reduce talk about value in the world to talk about the power of that world to induce subjective feelings of value. The resulting analysis would present us with what I have called elsewhere an endless stutter: "This is good" would mean something like "This causes me to value it," but that in turn would mean "This causes me to judge it to be good," which would in turn mean "This causes me to judge this to be something I judge to be . . .", and off we go.

I haven't come anywhere near to doing justice to the many quality papers in this volume. I recommend it to anyone who is interested in Stroud's work, and that should be anyone interested in philosophy.