The Post-Critical Kant: Understanding the Critical Philosophy through the Opus postumum

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Bryan Wesley Hall, The Post-Critical Kant: Understanding the Critical Philosophy through the Opus postumum, Routledge, 2015, 220pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138802148.

Reviewed by Veit Justus Rollmann, Frankfurt am Main


Post-Critical, not post-philosophical or un-Critical: Brian Wesley Hall's new book locates the famous gap in Kant's Critical philosophy and shows Kant's effort to bridge the gap in the fascicles of the so-called Opus postumum [OP].

Following the principle e pluribus unum, Hall's book contains some previously published essays on the subject and adds new material, thus forming a systematic unity that is more than just the sum of its parts. At first glance the chosen title is ambiguous and gives room for serious misunderstanding. Does post-Critical mean that Kant's latest drafts violate his own standards set up by his major works of the Critical era and go back beyond the limits to some sort of rather uncritical philosophy? Is the promised understanding in the subtitle based on highlighting the contradictions between Critical and post-Critical thinking? Quite the opposite: Hall's interpretation is based on the view that the post-Critical period manifested in the OP "marks a major reorientation of how he [Kant] views the Critical philosophy" and (according to Kant's early biographer L.E. Borowski, consistent with Kant's own views) "the post-Critical culmination of his Critical Philosophy" (p. 2). The reorientation is necessary because of the gap Kant mentions in his letters to Christian Garve and Johann Gottfried Kiesewetter from autumn 1798.

Most Kant scholars who have worked on the OP would agree that there is more than one problem in his Critical writings that Kant tries to solve in his latest drafts, but the bridging of the so-called gap must be crucial for Kant's Transcendental Idealism. The letters mentioned above leave enough room for speculation, but in the draft Farrago 1 written not long after them Kant himself localizes the gap in the transcendental part of his metaphysics of nature. In Hall's opinion, that gap lies in the Analytic of the Critique of Pure Reason [CPR] and more precisely in Kant's theory of Substance in the Analogies of Experience (e. g. Hall, p. 3, 23, 37, 207). Hall's study is divided into five chapters that have the character of self-contained essays, and an introduction that goes beyond the usual overview of the argument. Hall sets four textual and philosophical standards for his own work and for further research on the OP. Every study concerning Kant's last unfinished work should follow the interpretive principles of (i) maximal consistency with Kant's text, which requires addressing "texts that seem to conflict with the interpretation" (p. 5 f.), (ii) maximal consistency of Kant with himself, i.e. of the Critical and post-Critical Kant, (iii) philosophical plausibility, and (iv) reflection on the intentions Kant may have had in mind writing the drafts of the OP. In his introduction -- far from trying to be everybody's darling -- Hall argues that "all of the existing interpretations violate more than one of these principles" and so his own "should be preferred" to the competitors because he's following them (p. 6, 87). Leaving the defense to those being attacked, one must admit that it would be of great value if future works on the OP would bring themselves in line with Hall's standards. The reason for following them lies in the state of the drafts from which the edited OP was compiled. In a manuscript that has neither been published nor finally reviewed and composed for publication, any interpreter will find what he or she is seeking. Hall's picture of the situation is revealing: "In many ways, OP can be viewed like a philosophical Rorschach test. It is easy for commentators to see what they want to see" (p. 8).

The first chapter traces Kant's Critical theory of substance in the Analogies of Experience in CPR. The principle of the First Analogy in CPR A suggests that substance is contained in all appearances and persists as the relatively enduring empirical object itself through every change of the object's properties. When the category of substance is applied in this way, it functions as a principium individuationis for substances and makes their changes in time perceivable. The formulation of the principle in CPR B supports a different concept of substance. The persisting quantum of substance in nature, which is neither diminished nor increased, must be understood as a single substance in space, one that is omnipresent and sempiternal (Hall uses the term "Substance" in contrast to "substances" for the plurality of individual relatively enduring objects, p. 36). The concept of Substance is able to ensure the subject's experience of simultaneity and succession of empirical objects in a common spatiotemporal framework, but it lacks the ability to individuate these objects. In three steps

Hall provides support for both interpretations (Substance and then substances) and explains the problem resulting from Kant's equivocal use of substance in the Analogies of Experience. According to Hall's interpretation Kant faces a dilemma in the First Analogy which he is unable to resolve and "this constitutes a gap in Kant's Critical philosophy that he is unable to deal with given the tools available to him in CPR" (p. 51). Unequivocal interpretations (like e. g. Kenneth Westphal's, p. 49) are not able to solve the problem because Kant needs both concepts of substance in the Second and Third Analogy to explain causal relations between objects of experience and the simultaneous community of those objects in space. Kant therefore "requires a new concept of Substance different from the category of substance" (p. 51), and this leads to Kant's ether theory in the OP.

Chapter two gives attention to the development of the Kantian ether theory; chapter three offers a reconstruction of Kant's Ether Deduction in the Übergang section of OP. Hall attempts to present a valid and sound version of Kant's effort to prove a priori the existence of a primordial matter, named ether or caloric, which is the basis of the collective unity of all moving forces of matter that affect the sensibility of the subject and therefore functions as a principle of the absolute unity of possible experience. A goal of Hall's argumentation is to show that "the conclusion of the Ether Deduction is not only a constitutive thesis but also wholly consistent with Kant's transcendental Idealism/empirical realism" (p. 56).

Hall's focus in chapter two is the development of the Kantian conception of the Ether beginning with the Critical period. It is worth mentioning that this chosen starting point is not the absolute beginning of Kant's thinking about the concept and function of the so-called ether. In writings of the period labeled as pre-Critical Kant, for instance, Kant makes use of the concept as a methodical principle to reduce the number of causes in a metaphysics of nature. Hall himself is interested in a genuine Kantian theory of the Ether which helps "to solve certain important problems from the Critical era" (p. 72), and given this the starting point of his account is justified. The first section of this chapter is dedicated to Kant's Critical conception of the ether. In the sole reference to something like the ether in the Postulates of Empirical Thought in CPR, Kant states that if some intermediate being with an ontological state between matter and mind persists in space, its concept cannot be a priori but requires experience. Without the latter it is nothing more than just an 'empirically groundless' 'figment of the brain'.

Readers of the OP know that Kant's view of the ether changes between 1781 and 1799, and Hall's examination offers explanations for this change. Section two puts a focus on problems in other works like Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science [MFNS] and Critique of the Power of Judgment [CJ]. These problems, like the rejection of the atomistic position in a philosophy of nature, which according to Hall is "Kant's bête noir" (p. 74), and Kant's search for a solution help readers to understand the important role the Ether plays in Kant's last drafts. Hall's view on MFNS and CJ exemplifies two different problems whose solution is given by the evolution of the ether theory. The post-Critical ether allows for distinguishing between matter as such and physical bodies and thus for a theoretical approach to the constitution of bodies inorganic as well as organized. Hall adopts the view of Jeff Edwards and Martin Schönfeld that "Kant's theory of body formation anticipates contemporary field theory" (p. 79) and offers an "emergence account of the relationship between physical bodies and the field" (p. 80). If both kinds of bodies emerge from the ether, Kant completes his task of unifying nature as a whole in one system of natural science (f.e. p. 85). The effort to use the concept of emergence for the interpretation of Kant's theory of substance and matter in the OP opens much room for further discussion and gives interesting input for future research. The same emergence-relationship exists according to Hall between the one Substance and substances (see e.g. p. 60). The author -- following his own interpretive principles meticulously -- does not ignore the difficulties of an emergence account; in Hall's words: "When it comes to body formation, we can accept Kant's claim that physical bodies (or substances) emerge from the ether (or Substance), without having to accept his account of how they do so" (p. 85). With regard to the Übergang section, Kant's account is, to put it politely, vague. Here there is – in my opinion -- a parallel to the relation between specific laws of nature and transcendental laws of nature (like the principles in CPR). The former must be subsumed under the latter, but there is no answer in Kant's text to the question of how this goal can be achieved (more precisely there is no answer in CPR; CJ offers an answer, but OP shows that this answer is not Kant's last word on the topic).

In the case of the physical body, for example, the ether is, according to Kant, 'material for a body' (AA 21:215, Eckart Förster's translation). Every molecule or atom of a specific material body is itself a body in the sense of the OP because it has a limited quantity, some kind of form and structure, and it is possible to both limit its extension to a well defined space and to measure its weight. All these properties cannot be those of the ether, and therefore it is impossible to compose bodies out of it. Nevertheless the ether is the principle and basis of body constitution: "physical bodies emerge from, but are not reducible (in terms of the part-whole relation) to the ether" (p. 83). Maybe a future conference on the OP will focus on the emergence concept as an interpretive tool for a new approach to the OP.

Problems like the matter-body distinction and the formation of bodies are in Hall's view not able to explain the gap in Kant's Critical philosophy because they are part of the doctrinal transformation and not of the critique as such.

Chapters three and four are dedicated to the role the ether plays in Kant's post-Critical theory of experience. In the first place the ether becomes a principle of possible experience, and the role it could play in the metaphysics of nature is now only an aspect of this theoretical frame. What Hall wants to show in these chapters is that there is no exclusive disjunction between a conceptual/formal or actual/material understanding of the ether. For Hall "both disjuncts are true" (p. 87) and "Kant can be committed to the actuality of the ether without committing himself to transcendental realism" (p.21). I agree with his interpretation on this point, too. The post-Critical Kant is still a Transcendental Idealist. The ether is a concept a priori, but this concept determines the way some material for the possibility of experience is given: as a collective unity of the moving forces of matter. It is a dynamic principle which functions as the cause for the global mechanics and its explanation in a scientific theory model.

Hall shows that Kant provides an argument for a Critical presupposition in the Transcendental Ideal section of CPR: that concerning the totality of empirical reality and the sum total of all predicates. Hall is right that "Kant makes the connection between the Transcendental Ideal and the Ether Deduction explicit in the Übergang section" (p.100). One may add to Hall's demonstration that this explicitness is not limited to the use of the principle of thoroughgoing determination; even in Kant's wording, the connection is evident. Only in Übergang 11 and in the Transcendental Ideal does Kant mention the all encompassing [allbefassende] experience.

In chapter three Hall argues in four sections that the Ether Deduction aims to establish the actuality of the ether as a material condition for the unity of experience. A discussion of the relation between the Übergang section and the whole transition project follows a formal reconstruction of Kant's argument in Übergang 11 based on Hall's translation of passages from this draft. Then Hall argues for his thesis that the Ether deduction marks a significant post-Critical development of Kant's Critical thinking and discusses the steps of his reconstructed proof in comparison with Kant's Critical positions. The fourth and final section poses and answers the question of what Kant's intentions may have been and of how far he was successful.

Hall's reconstruction of Kant's proof is convincing, and his diagrams are helpful. Still Übergang 11 offers only one version of Kant's many ways to prove the existence of the so-called ether. According to Förster, the state of the Ether Deduction in the OP is never definitely fixed. Other texts in the Übergang section suggest that Kant has abandoned his former proof strategy for the new view that the existence of the material condition of experience is implied in his concept of experience and could be proven analytically without violating his own restrictions concerning proof strategies. As Hall points out, the Ether Deduction's starting point is synthetic (see p. 107). Nevertheless in OP we face "a dramatic rethinking of what transcendental arguments are capable of proving" (p. 11).

While Hall's reconstruction of Kant's argumentation shows his success in proving the actuality of the ether, the following chapter sheds light on the further development of the ether theory. In Convoluts 10 and 11, Kant puts much more emphasis on the role the a priori concept of the ether plays in his broader post-Critical conception of physics, which becomes more and more identified with a theory of experience in general. Kant addresses the problem of how this concept is applied by apperception (by means of the Principles of Pure Understanding) to make the unity of experience possible. Here in chapter four Hall shows that the post-Critical development of his theoretical philosophy offers Kant the tools he was lacking in CPR to bridge the gap Hall had identified in chapter one:

Unlike in the Analogies, in OP Kant clearly delineates between two different and mutually irreducible concepts of substance.  . . . With these two a priori concepts in hand, Kant is able to overcome the dilemma that faces his theory of substance . . . and so fill the gap in his critical philosophy (p. 144).

As Hall has pointed out earlier, "the Ether Deduction holds the key to understanding both the gap in Kant's Critical philosophy as well as how the transition project aims to bridge the gap" (p. 11).

In the fifth and final chapter Hall turns to to a problem the first commentators on OP had already discussed: the problem of affection. According to Hall's interpretation of Convolut 7, appearances are intrinsic relations between undetermined as well as determined phenomenal objects and subjects. Undetermined ether as the dynamical principle of any representation stands in relation with transcendental apperception which is likewise undetermined. Determined phenomenal objects and subjects "emerge from the joint activity of the ether . . . and apperception" (p.184, see also 209). Hall's account offers a new solution to one of the oldest problems in Kant scholarship.

Hall's book is the second study in the English language dedicated entirely to an interpretation of Kant's OP. Both his elaborate analysis and the textual and philosophical standards which he sets up and strictly observes are the product of long lasting preoccupation with the subject matter. The interpretive principles and the results of his work will be influential in research on Kant's last drafts for years to come.