The Post-Racial Ideal

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Howard McGary, The Post-Racial IdealMarquette University Press, 2012, 80pp., $15.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780874621815.

Reviewed by Falguni A. Sheth, Hampshire College


This article-length monograph is the published version of Marquette University's annual Aquinas lecture, delivered in February 2012 by Howard McGary. In it, McGary dismisses the validity of the claim that we are "beyond race" and what it might mean to move to a post-racial ideal, concluding that we are not yet not in a position to inhabit the moral acceptability of a post-racial ideal. Instead, McGary endeavors to explore the significance and implications of racial identities through the views of Anthony Appiah and Tommie Shelby. Before that, however, he briefly considers the meaning of racism and reviews several debates on assimilationism, black nationalism, pragmatic solidarity.

Why are we not ready to move to a post-racial ideal? According to McGary, such a move depends on the false assumption that race is necessarily a negative or destructive concept., For McGary, who is perhaps a reluctant non-eliminativist, racial identities are neither intrinsically negative nor inessential. Rather, racial identities can help us assess where and how far a racial group is removed from political and social justice. By considering races with a view to justice, we can retain "benign" racial identities (15). Throughout his lecture, McGary's underlying question seems to be whether colorblindness or some form of racial awareness is a better approach to take in addressing racial, social, justice.

McGary seems most concerned with certain elements of racism. His broader concern is more with institutional racism than with individual racism. Institutional racism is, in some ways, much more difficult to assess and change because it is embedded in the policies of organizations, and -- I might add -- the laws of a given society. Thus, although McGary doesn't mention it in this lecture, some of his earlier work addresses the issues of reparations and affirmative action, the relationship of liberalism and racism, and the efficacy of multiracial organizations in combatting racial injustice. We see some echoes of his earlier writings, to which I will return below. Another urgent concern is the relation of racial identities to racial/political solidarity, and in turn to the kinds of policies that societies should legislate to manage the injustices that stem from racial prejudice.

Although his concern is with institutional racism and questions of solidarity, McGary still begins with the fundamental question of what racism is. He considers J.L.A. Garcia's and Joshua Glasgow's notions of racism. For Garcia, racism can be differentiated from a wrong belief about a culture/race, if the incorrect belief doesn't drive the individual holding that belief to act discriminatorily or with ill-will towards a member of that culture/race. In other words, Garcia, who views all racism as morally unacceptable, wishes to distinguish between attitude (ill-will) and belief. He believes that racist attitudes cause racist beliefs, not the other way around. Moreover, he sees a distinction between dislike of a black person based on a racial designation (the fact of blackness) rather than on something to do with blacks. McGary finds both these distinctions to be problematic, in part because of the internal incoherence of the distinctions, but also because Garcia, like Appiah, is interested in parsing racism out on an individual level, and thus not contributing to the more urgent issue of addressing institutional racism.

The urgency of institutional racism emerges from the difficulty of pinpointing and addressing the racist-attitudes of the individuals who drive such policies. Turning to Glasgow, McGary considers Glasgow's definition of racism, which is a "kind of disrespect." (25) Glasgow, whose A Theory of Race, is concerned with drawing out a notion of race that can accommodate everyday or "folk" language usage as well as technical language. Even allowing for Glasgow's usage, McGary suggests that his account is not strong enough to allow us to understand the weight and the singular origins of institutional racism, insisting that he doubts "that we can trace all of the cases of institutional racism to some disrespect by some agent or agents." (25)

I disagree with McGary about the relevance of the notion of disrespect to institutional racism. I think it may be the case that most, if not all, instances of institutional racism are grounded on disrespect. But the issue here is whether one can easily illustrate the explicit relation between disrespect and institutional racism. For example, most (secular, public, or non-profit) universities have no express policies about acceptable and unacceptable personality characteristics that search committees can consider when deciding whom to hire in a department. Professionally speaking, it is possible to like or prefer one candidate over another because "he is gentle and patient," or to dislike or rule out a candidate because "she is aggressive or opinionated," -- especially if the race of the candidates is not explicitly mentioned. Yet, if correlating the comments with the racial criteria results in the interesting "coincidence" of negative personality types coinciding with black candidates, or with positive personality judgments coinciding with white or non-black candidates, it is certainly possible to make a strong argument that correlates "disrespect," and racial identity. But it is difficult to record, assess, and adjudicate the instances in which such racial disrespect occurs. Nevertheless, I agree with McGary that it is important to name an institution's racism, rather than just calling a structure "unacceptable," as Glasgow suggests.

McGary takes up Appiah's argument for colorblindness as the best moral approach to justice. For Appiah, as for Shelby, though to a lesser degree, human beings owe each other the same moral regard, regardless of their racial relationship. For Appiah, races are not like families, who may have grounds to be partial to family members over non-family. Adoptive family members may have reason to be partial because of social rather than blood ties, but racial groups do not have any such grounds. Here again, McGary takes issue with Appiah's criticism of racial self-identification. For Appiah, racial self-identification "in the existing political order" amounts to "obsessive racial loyalty and shapes our lives too strictly." (61) However, McGary suggests that pluralism is a worthy aspiration, if approached correctly, that is, by "liberat(ing) pluralism from the destructive ideologies that cause people to grasp on to polarizing differences rather than unifying commonalities." (62)

In this regard, McGary's position is cautious, but much more optimistic than he was over a decade before. Harkening back to his 1997 Journal of Ethics article, "Racism, Social Justice, and Interracial Coalitions," McGary expressed doubt -- but not outright rejection -- for Cornel West's suggestion that the key to combatting racism effectively lies in interracial coalitions (McGary 1997, 259). Contra West, McGary insists that in a racist society, there are many perils in approaching racial injustice through multiracial coalitions, not least of which is the possibility of foundering over the slightest of racial disagreements (McGary 1997, 264). He emphasizes that trust and understanding remain crucial to the success of a non-racist society, but doubts that such trust is possible. Given a society divided by racial injustice, groups will be partial to their own interests, thereby increasing the unlikeliness of different racial groups coming to an agreement. (McGary 1997, 260). Thus, for McGary, contra Appiah, to suggest that racial pluralism is possible and even defensible under certain conditions appears a slight shift in his position.

Perhaps the most compelling part of McGary's lecture is his discussion of Tommie Shelby's notion of a pragmatic black solidarity as the grounds for a racial solidarity. In his book, We Who Are Dark, Shelby argues in favor of a cultural black nationalism, or a solidarity that is pragmatic rather than grounded on racial oppression or a nationalist ideology. Shelby's is a subtle, and at times, difficult position, especially since he eschews, on the one hand, a "multicorporatist" approach in which blacks form multiple political organizations to address concerns of the black political community. A multicorporate position would require blacks to close ranks -- and even if they were able to express the political will of black people -- would run the risk of being racially exclusive, and thus detract from the broader advantages that multiracial alliances would engender. Shelby also rejects the expedient suggestion that lies at the other extreme, namely that blacks "should . . . reject race-specific political solidarity . . . and abandon demands for state-sponsored measures that are explicitly and exclusively aimed at helping African Americans." (Shelby 2005, 132). For those who believe that the success of resisting racial injustice, and black empowerment, lies in forming a solidarity based on one's position at the receiving end of anti-black racism, Shelby suggests that multiracial alliances are an important strategy that should not be overlooked.

McGary's concern with Shelby's account is that racial identity has a certain primary importance that cannot be transcended by mere common interests. This is true for several reasons: first, those who are not black may share some interests and goals of blacks, but cannot ever fully understand the implications of being perceived as black, and thus cannot fully understand what it is like to be the target of anti-black racism. Consequently, they cannot be expected to share all the political and social justice goals of blacks. McGary prefers a slightly more robust conception of black unity, although it is thinner than the black nationalist frameworks put forward by others. McGary suggests a black unity based on racial identity as the ground for a more productive racial solidarity than a culturally pragmatic solidarity of the kind that Shelby suggests.

For McGary, then, the question of a post-racial ideal, and his broader concern with structural or institutional racism, is ultimately related to the question of how racial injustice, primarily in the form of anti-black racism, can be best addressed. Until such racial injustice can be satisfactorily defined and addressed, he cannot concede that the United States is now ready to address and incorporate a post-racial ideal.

The length constraints of his lecture preempt the possibility of McGary's spelling out in richer detail which methods would be most effective in addressing institutional and structural racial injustice. This seems to be the most obvious lack in his discussion. Nevertheless, McGary's argument is important and significant since it points to some of the key thinkers who are working on issues of racism and racial injustice in the field of philosophy at the moment, and it considers the assumptions and shortcomings that are involved in declaring a "post-racial ideal." For those reasons, this monograph is an important work.


Glasgow, Joshua. 2009. A Theory of Race. New York: Routledge.

McGary, Howard. 1997. "Racism, Social Justice and Interracial Coalitions." Journal of Ethics. Vol. 1, no. 3. Pp. 249-264.

Shelby, Tommie. 2005. We Who are Dark. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.