The Poverty of Conceptual Truth: Kant's Analytic/Synthetic Distinction and the Limits of Metaphysics

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R. Lanier Anderson, The Poverty of Conceptual Truth: Kant's Analytic/Synthetic Distinction and the Limits of Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2015, 408pp., $82.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198724575.

Reviewed by Colin McLear, University of Nebraska--Lincoln


One of the central, and perhaps most (in)famous, contributions of Kant's critical philosophy is his distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments (or propositions). This distinction has been the subject of numerous debates, including but not limited to two central issues: the cogency of the distinction and its novelty in Kant's work.

R. Lanier Anderson's excellent new book aims to show that we can achieve new insight into Kant's distinction via sustained attention to his historical context. In particular, he argues that full appreciation of Kant's argument for the existence of synthetic judgment requires proper attention to the details of Kant's rationalist forbears and especially to the philosophies of Leibniz and Christian Wolff.

Specifically, Anderson argues for four claims.

1.     Analyticity is best understood in terms of the logical notion of conceptual containment.

2.     The logical containment conception of the analytic/synthetic distinction is a central feature of the mature critical philosophy and absent prior to 1772.

3.     The ineliminable syntheticity of mathematics is best understood in terms of a critique of the limited expressive power of containment analyticity.

4.     The main thrust of Kant's critique of rationalist metaphysics is an argument concerning the limits of containment analyticity.

The book has four parts, each focused on one of the four claims. There is also an epilogue devoted to the issue of empirical concept formation and three appendices addressing or augmenting discussion of issues raised in the book. As the structure of the work suggests, a great deal of ground is covered, much of which I cannot discuss here. I limit myself to canvassing the main thread of Anderson's argument as well as some brief criticism of it.

Containment Analyticity

The problem the first Critique is traditionally taken to address is explaining how synthetic a priori judgments are possible (B19).[1] Answering this question is supposed to explain how metaphysics might flower into a genuinely scientific form of inquiry not the dubious and disorganized mess in which Kant finds it. Anderson's study distinguishes itself by focusing on what he calls the "preliminary" (p. 5) problem of synthetic judgment itself, without the added wrinkle of examining its a priori or a posteriori status.

When Kant introduces the analytic/synthetic distinction in the first Critique, he does so in terms of three different criteria: containment,[2] identity, and informativeness (A6-7/B10-11). Later in theCritique he adds a fourth: cognition "in accordance with the principle of contradiction" that something cannot at the same time be and not be (A151/B190). Despite providing four different characterizations, Kant seems to take the containment definition as central, but many have objected to his doing so. For example, J.G. Maaß (1789) objected that the containment conception rests on potentially idiosyncratic psychological facts concerning what a person actually thinks in, or otherwise associates with, the concept in question. Quine objected that this notion of containment is mere metaphor and suggested that we understand analyticity in terms of truth by virtue of the meanings of the words or concepts constituting the judgment. Further, Quine (1951), and more recently James Van Cleve (1999: chapter 2) and Ian Proops (2005), among others, have objected that the containment definition is unduly narrow in that it applies only to judgments of subject-predicate form.

At least in part because of these problems the prevailing conception of analyticity, for the last one hundred years or so, has been one in accord with Kant's second characterization of analyticity -- viz. contradiction. On this conception a judgment is analytic just in case its negation is a contradiction. As Anderson notes (p. 13), this interpretation of analyticity has been accepted by a wide variety of philosophers and interpreters including Frege, Lewis, Quine, Van Cleve, and Proops.

Those familiar with Anderson's previous work know he contends that the containment conception of analyticity is the central and most fundamental of the four (chapter 1; see Anderson 2004; 2005). It is because of the containment relation that subject and predicate concepts may be said to be (partially) identical in an analytic judgment, that the negation of an analytic judgment is a contradiction, and that synthetic judgments are supposed to be genuinely ampliative while analytic ones are not. But containment can only play this central role if a clear (i.e. non-metaphorical) articulation of the sense in which one concept may "contain" another can be given.

By means of a contextual analysis of Leibniz and Wolff, Kant's rationalist predecessors, Anderson argues that we should understand containment non-metaphorically, and as a fundamentally logical notion. In the first five chapters, Anderson exposes the roots of Kant's conception of analytic containment in the logic of concepts that was predominant in Europe throughout the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries.

According to Anderson, the notion of containment should be understood wholly intensionally, in terms of what he calls a strongly reciprocal and hierarchically ordered relationship amongst concepts. The containment relationship is strongly reciprocal just in case two conditions are satisfied:

first . . . whatever is included in the content of some concept must cover that concept within its extension, and conversely, whatever concepts fall under a given concept in its extension must include it in their contents. And then second (this is what makes the reciprocity strong in the relevant sense), concepts with the same extension also have the same content, and vice versa. (p. 55)

So two concepts that share the same extension will share the same content and conversely. Sharing the same content and extension also means that the two concepts would have to exclude the very same marks. Hence, the two notions of content and extension cannot come apart. Any two concepts that share the same content and extension are what Kant terms "convertible" or "reciprocal" concepts (p. 55).

Concepts that stand in these strongly reciprocal relations can then be hierarchically ordered on the basis of the marks that they contain. A concept is "higher" with respect to those concepts falling in its extension (i.e. those concepts which contain it as part of their content) and "lower" with respect to those concepts it contains (i.e. have it as a member of their extension). The higher-lower relationship is further understood by Kant in terms of the genus-species relationship.

Modulo some further details, the resulting picture is one according to which the notion of containment is given a "precise, rule-governed understanding" (p. 57). These "rules of division" by genus and species are twofold:

1.     The division of a genus must be complete -- the various species of a genus, taken together, exhaust the genus.

2.     Membership in a species must be exclusive -- no species may be predicated of another.

Putting all this together then, for one concept to 'contain' another is to have that concept as a member of its extension in a strict hierarchical ordering of genus/species relationships where concepts are distinguished according to their (non-overlapping) differentia.[3]

According to Anderson, understanding Kant's conception of analyticity in terms of containment has at least two clear advantages. First, it accords with the notion of containment advocated by Wolff and his followers (e.g. Alexander Baumgarten and Georg Friedrich Meier). Anderson takes this to be a significant virtue, not only for the correct appreciation of the historical record but also because it gives Kant dialectical traction in his criticism of rationalist metaphysics. By assuming the widespread view of conceptual containment outlined above, it allows Kant room to criticize his rationalist opponents without seeming to beg the question against them. Second, it very clearly cashes out the metaphor of containment and provides Kant with the material to reply to some of the criticisms mentioned above. For example, with respect to Maaß's criticism concerning the unduly psychological aspect of Kant's view of analyticity, Kant can reply (as he in fact instructed his student Schultz to) that his division between analytic and synthetic judgment has nothing to do with the psychological associations or connections made by a subject but rather depends solely on the issue of logical division and the containment relations determined thereby.

Why would one endorse such a narrow conception of analyticity? Anderson discusses several motivations, including the need for a method of discovery and enhanced clarity in science (chapter 3). Ultimately though, Anderson argues that it is a commitment within Wolffian metaphysics to the "essentially logical character of metaphysical truth" (p. 85), and especially the commitment to deriving all truths from the principle of contradiction (p. 80), which serves as the primary basis for the commitment to containment analyticity.

Kant's central insight, according to Anderson, is seeing that containment analyticity results in a system of concepts whose expressive power is weaker than what is needed to express truths in a variety of domains, and in particular, in mathematics and metaphysics. Anderson provides convincing argument that if we assume a theory of analytic truth along the lines of containment and according to the exclusion and exhaustiveness rules specified above, then we are unable to express basic arithmetic and geometric truths, e.g., '7 + 5 = 12' or Euclid's angle-sum theorem.

Anderson also offers an historical account of how Kant arrived at his view of synthetic truth. He argues that Kant began the 1760s with a distinction between the analytic and synthetic that was merely methodological and epistemic. The logical distinction, in terms of which Kant would recognize that there are truths not expressible solely by means of conceptual containment relations, was, according to Anderson, not clearly in view for Kant until sometime after his letter to Herz of 1772. Anderson locates the note R4634, dated to 1772-3, as the first explicit articulation of the mature problematic, which is very close to the version of the distinction that Kant puts forward in the first Critique at A6-7/B10.

Parts I - III thus offer both a philosophical examination of the nature of analyticity and a historical account of how Kant arrived at the need for a logical theory possessing greater expressive power than the traditional theory of containment analyticity allowed. This realization marked the key turning point towards Kant's mature critical philosophy.

Is Containment Central to the Critical Philosophy?

However, even if one agrees with Anderson regarding central aspects of his philosophical and historical account, one may nevertheless worry that the analytic/synthetic distinction is not as absolutely central to characterizing Kant's critical thought or his critique of traditional metaphysics as Anderson believes. For example, Anderson argues that the distinction is the basis of (i) the downfall of German rationalism, (ii) Kant's emphasis on the need for a philosophical method of critique, and (iii) Kant's critique of the traditional theory of mathematics (p. 41).

Two points suggest that there are other competing considerations. First, central aspects of Kant's mature argument against German rationalism concern not the expressive limitations of our concepts but rather the cognitive limitations of the discursive intellect. The notion of 'discursivity' is not meant merely as a synonym for 'conceptual'. Instead, when Kant characterizes the intellect (i.e. the understanding and reason) as discursive, he signals the mode according to which the intellect functions in constructing and connecting representations. This mode is characterized by the intellect's manner of moving to and fro and from part to part -- what Kant calls the "running through and gathering together" of representations (A77/B103; A99).

Kant's emphasis on the limitations of the discursive intellect plays a crucial role in several key arguments. For example, consider the fourth argument in the Metaphysical Exposition of Space for the infinitude of (our representation of) space. Kant argues there that space is represented as infinite and that this is impossible if the representation of space were fundamentally conceptual, for "no concept, as such, can be thought as if it contained an infinite set of representations within itself" (A25/B40). The argument turns on the claim that grasping an infinite set of conceptual marks of each individual space or location would be impossible for any finite being. This is not (or at least not solely) an issue concerning expressive power but rather one dependent on the assumption of cognitive limitations (and not ones limited merely to the fact that our intellect is not creative, see p. 197). This critique of conceptualist explanations of our capacity to represent infinite space is part of a broader distinction between the partwise movement of the intellect in its cognition of objects and the holistic manner by which intuition apprehends its object, a distinction which Kant maintains throughout the critical period (see, e.g., Kant 2000: 5:407-8, 409).[4]

Second, one of the most characteristic worries that Kant articulates in the critical period is the idea that there is a particular kind of cognitive illusion that we are susceptible to in cases of complex reasoning and that this can lead us to believe that we have successfully essayed a thought concerning some subject matter even when this is not actually the case. Specifically, Kant worries that mere logical coherence is too weak to show that the object of a concept (or more precisely, the state of affairs indicated in a categorical judgment) is genuinely metaphysically "really" possible. He distinguishes between logical and real sorts of possibility in terms of the notion of cancellation [Aufhebung] (pp. 162-5). The subject matter of a thought is logically possible if the thought's constituent concepts may be combined in judgment without contradiction and thus without being logically canceled out (A151/B190; Negative Magnitudes 2:171-2). The subject matter of a thought is really possible, in contrast, if it can be shown that the subject matter to which the thought corresponds consists of properties which are mutually metaphysically compossible and not, in Kant's terms, 'really repugnant'. Since real repugnance cannot be determined via consideration of the logical possibility of the subject as conceived, cognition requires the demonstration of the real possibility of the object through some means other than mere conception.[5]

This is something that bothered Leibniz as well (which Anderson acknowledges, see p. 119; see p. 93 for discussion of similar worries in Wolff). In his "Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas" (1684) Leibniz considers the problems that might arise in inquiry when analyzing concepts. He says,

we cannot safely use definitions for drawing conclusions unless we know first that they are real definitions, that is, that they include no contradictions, because we can draw contradictory conclusions from notions that include contradictions, which is absurd. (Leibniz 1989: 25)

Leibniz worries that there are cases in which we attempt to think of something (he considers the case of Descartes' proof of God's existence, and of the "fastest motion") even though we actually lack a coherent idea of it. This leads him to distinguish between nominal definitions, which are sufficient for distinguishing one thing from another, and real definitions, "from which one establishes that a thing is possible" (Leibniz 1989: 26). Leibniz is here construing metaphysical possibility in terms of the logical compossibility of predicates -- the logical coherence of the concept ensures the metaphysical possibility of the object of that concept. In this Kant disagrees. But both Leibniz and Kant seem to think that there is a genuine issue concerning our epistemic access to the coherence of the subject matter of our thoughts, especially in complex cases like mathematics (or metaphysics).

For example, Kant takes the issue of real possibility to be a general condition on cognition, saying in the preface to the second edition of the Critique that,

To cognize an object, it is required that I be able to prove its possibility (whether by the testimony of experience from its actuality or a priori through reason). But I can think whatever I like, as long as I do not contradict myself, i.e., as long as my concept is a possible thought, even if I cannot give any assurance whether or not there is a corresponding object somewhere within the sum total of all possibilities. But in order to ascribe objective validity to such a concept (real possibility, for the first sort of possibility was merely logical) something more is required. (Bxxvi)

I take Kant to be making here an epistemic rather than a logical point. Moreover, this epistemic point seems to hold even if one construes truth solely in terms of containment, for it might be the case that even if all truths hold in virtue of containment, we nevertheless have no reliable epistemic access to the difference between mere thought and genuine grasp of (logically) coherent ideas. If that is correct, then at least part of the motivation for Kant's two-stem theory of cognition at the heart of his critical philosophy, where intuition and concept work together, comes from concern about our epistemic reliability with regard to assessment of the possibility of what we are thinking rather than with a logical concern for the expressive power of what is thought.

Analyticity and the Critique of Metaphysics

In Part IV, Anderson connects Kant's conception of synthetic truth to his critique of traditional rationalist metaphysics. Anderson argues that the Dialectic of the first Critique should be understood in terms of the articulation of a "master argument". According to this argument, judgments concerning the traditional objects of metaphysics -- God, the soul, and the cosmos -- should be "object-implicating" (p. 276) in the sense that they must demonstrate the existence of their objects even though such objects "are not independently given to us through experience or any other direct presentation" (p. 277). Indeed, "the whole point of the conceptualist [i.e. rationalist] metaphysical program was to exploit relations among concepts" that would "force conclusions about the nature ofwhat really must exist, even though we can have no direct experience of it" (pp. 273-4; emphasis in original). But, Anderson argues, the existence of such objects cannot be determined via conceptual means alone. Hence traditional metaphysics cannot in principle provide the kind of account it purports to concerning the central subject matter of metaphysics.

One puzzling feature of this attempt to unify the interpretation of the analytic/synthetic distinction with Kant's criticism of rationalist metaphysics more generally is that existence assumptions were largely not an issue of concern for German rationalist metaphysics. Instead, rationalist metaphysics, at least in the eighteenth century, was concerned with the most general features of any possible being, existent or not (which Anderson seems to acknowledges, e.g., pp. 83, 128). This is taken as the initial topic of metaphysics by both Wolff (e.g. 1751: §12) and Baumgarten (e.g. 2013: §7). Kant himself criticizes traditional metaphysics for putting the concept of possibility and impossibility before the concept of what an object is in general (A290/B346).

A further problem for Anderson's analysis concerns the role of experience in Wolffian metaphysical proof. Anderson contends that Wolffian rationalism is concerned with purely conceptual demonstration in metaphysics. Experience can play no role. However, Wolff did allow that we have direct experience of subject matters relevant to metaphysical inquiry. At the beginning of theGerman Metaphysics he provides a rather Cartesian sounding proof of one's own existence based on one's conscious direct experience of one's self, an experience that "No one who is not completely out of his mind can doubt" (1751: §1). Wolff uses experience of the nature of one's own mind to warrant acceptance of the principle of non-contradiction (1736: §27). Wolff also bases at least one proof of God's existence on the "indubitable experience" of the existence of one's self (1751: §928, 945).[6]

In general, Wolff seems to allow experience a role in demonstration, and thus in metaphysics, that stands in serious tension with the account of Wolff's system given by Anderson. For example, in the German Logic (1754), Wolff argues that the notion of a demonstration should include a variety of grounds, including experience.

However, one should not object that, outside of mathematics at least, an unusual meaning is being assigned to the word demonstration, since everyone admits that a demonstration is supposed to be a proof that leaves no room for doubt. Accordingly, no grounds can be found which this characteristic other than definitions, experiences, and so-called empty propositions. (Wolff 1754: chapter 4, §21)

As Wolff subsequently argues, experience, and specifically "clear" [klar] or "correct" [richtig] experience, can figure in particular demonstrations in the form of "basic judgments" [Grund-Urteil] that are arrived at immediately and without inference. Wolff takes such experience to be both singular and the appropriate basis of "universal truths" (Wolff 1754: chapter 5, §15).

Anderson would presumably object that since Wolff construes all truth in terms of derivation from the principle of contradiction, appeals to the role of experience in demonstration are ultimately based on that principle and thus depend on containment relations between the concepts constituting the propositional content of experience (pp. 80-2). One difficulty for Anderson's reading is that Wolff is not always consistent in the relationship he posits between experience and the principle of contradiction. For example, in the Philosophia prima sive Ontologia (1736: §27) Wolff considers experience the "foundation of the principle of contradiction" [fundamentum principii contradictionis].

One way to interpret Wolff's remarks consistently, which Anderson does not address, would be to distinguish between the fundamental explanation of how a judgment might be true and the explanation of how it might be warranted. Wolff could consistently think that the explanation of a truth depends on containment, and thus the principle of contradiction, while nevertheless denying that all warrant depends on the principle. Instead, he might allow experience a fundamental role in warranting judgment, including warrant concerning the principle itself. If this is correct then it is no longer obvious that Wolffian rationalism seeks to warrant all metaphysical claims in "strictly logico-conceptual terms" (p. 271). What would make some claim true might be construable only in terms of containment, but our warrant for believing that truth -- using Wolff's rather capacious notion of demonstration quoted above -- might also appeal to experience in some fundamental way.

It may well be that Wolff's philosophy is, as Lewis White Beck has called it, a "confused mixture of rationalistic and empiricistic elements" (1969: 267). If true, Wolff may have no ultimately cogent position from which to argue. And even if he did have a cogent argument, this doesn't mean that Kant read him as providing one. But part of the plausibility of reading the Dialectic of the firstCritique as engaging in a "master argument" along the lines Anderson describes depends on the aptness of Anderson's reading of Wolff and the centrality to Wolff's system of the principle of contradiction and the notion of conceptual containment. If Wolff is plausibly read as I've suggested, then there are non-logical considerations that would need accounting for in an argument against Wolffian metaphysics, ones to which the master argument does not attend.

In closing, and despite any misgivings that I have voiced, I want to emphasize that this is an extraordinarily rich book, and I've been able to discuss only a few central aspects of it. It is also clearly and engagingly written. Beck said of Wolff that he "ruthlessly bores" (1969: 258). In light of this, we can perhaps better appreciate Anderson's feat of devoting significant attention to the Wolffian rationalist system while doing anything but. Instead, he presents us with a compelling interpretation of Kant's conception of analyticity and its role in the maturation of the critical philosophy. I highly recommend the book, not only to Kant scholars but also to those interested in the history of the analytic/synthetic distinction as well as the history of German rationalism more generally.


Anderson, R Lanier. 2004. "It Adds Up After All: Kant's Philosophy of Arithmetic in Light of the Traditional Logic." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69 (3): 501-40.

-- -- -- . 2005. "The Wolffian Paradigm and Its Discontents: Kant's Containment Definition of Analyticity in Historical Context." Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 87 (1): 22-74.

Baumgarten, Alexander. 2013. Metaphysics: A Critical Translation with Kant's Elucidations, Selected Notes, and Related Materials. Edited by Courtney D. Fugate and John Hymers. Bloomsbury Academic.

Beck, Lewis White. 1969. Early German Philosophy. Harvard University Press.

Chignell, Andrew. 2011. "Real Repugnance and Our Ignorance of Things-in-Themselves: A Lockean Problem in Kant and Hegel." In Internationales Jahrbuch Des Deutschen Idealismus 2009: Glaube Und Vernunft, edited by Fred Rush, Jürgen Stolzenberg, and Paul W. Franks, 135-59. Walter de Gruyter.

-- -- -- . 2014. "Modal Motivations for Noumenal Ignorance: Knowledge, Cognition, and Coherence." Kant-Studien 105 (4): 573-97.

Dyck, Corey W. 2014. Kant and Rational Psychology. Oxford University Press.

Kant, Immanuel. 2000. Critique of the Power of Judgment. Edited by Paul Guyer. Cambridge University Press.

Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm Freiherr. 1989. Philosophical Essays. Edited by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Hackett Publishing.

Maaß, J.G. 1789. "Über den höchsten Grundsatz der synthetischen Urtheile; in Beziehung auf die Theorie von der mathematischen Gewissheit." Philosophiches Magazin II (2). Halle: 186-231.

Proops, Ian. 2005. "Kant's Conception of Analytic Judgment." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 70 (3): 588-612.

Quine, Willard Van Orman. 1951. "Two Dogmas of Empiricism." The Philosophical Review 60 (1): 20-43.

Van Cleve, James. 1999. Problems from Kant. Oxford University Press.

Warren, Daniel. 2001. Reality and Impenetrability in Kant's Philosophy of Nature. New York: Routledge.

Watkins, Eric. 2005. Kant and the Metaphysics of Causality. Cambridge University Press.

Wolff, Christian. 1736. Philosophia prima sive Ontologia methodo scientifica pretractata, qua omnis cognitionis humanae principia continentur. Frankfurt.

-- -- -- . 1751. Vernünfftige Gedancken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt. Halle.

-- -- -- . 1754. Vernünfftige Gedancken von den Kräften des menschlichen Verstandes und ihrem richtigen Gebrauche in Erkentniss der Wahrheit. Hildesheim: Olms.

[1]Citations to the Critique of Pure Reason follow the normal format of providing the page in the 1781 edition (A) and the page in the 1787 edition (B), separated by a slash, e.g. A151/B190. Quotations from the Critique use the Guyer/Wood translation: Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, trans. and ed. Paul Guyer and Allen Wood (Cambridge University Press, 1998). Citations to other works of Kant give the volume and page number in the Academy edition, Kants gesammelte Schriften, edited by the Berlin-Brandenburg Academy of Sciences (Walter de Gruyter, 1900- ).

[2]More specifically, containment-or-exclusion. As Proops 2005 shows, and with which Anderson agrees, Kant intends his characterization of analyticity to apply not only to affirmative subject-predicate judgments but also to negative ones as well as falsities (e.g. A6/B10, A154/B193; see also Anderson's discussion, p. 19). In these latter cases the subject and predicate are related by means of the exclusion of the predicate from the subject concept (and thus the contradiction that would result if it were included in the subject). I'll continue to speak of containment, but that will be shorthand for the more complex notion of containment-or-exclusion.

[3]As Anderson points out (pp. 114-122), Leibniz's conception of containment is much more relaxed than Wolff's and does not require exhaustive division, instead permitting partial overlap amongst concepts (e.g. `<AB>` and `<BC>` might both be contained in `<ABC>`). But this more flexible notion of containment beings various problems with it, which Anderson discuses. I'll stay with the Wolff/Kant characterization in my discussion above.

[4]This distinction is also present in Leibniz's discussion of the difference between intuitive and symbolic thinking. See, e.g., Leibniz 1989:24-5.

[5]For further discussion of the logical/real distinction see (Warren 2001), chapter 1; (Watkins 2005): 162-5; (Chignell 2011): 144-5; (Chignell 2014): 581-2.

[6]For an examination of the role of experience in Wolff's metaphysics, particularly in his psychology, see Dyck 2014: chapter 1, to which I owe much of this discussion.