The Power of Religion in the Public Sphere

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Eduardo Mendieta and Jonathan VanAntwerpen (eds.), The Power of Religion in the Public Sphere, Columbia University Press, 2011, 137pp., $19.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231156462.

Reviewed by James Swindal, Duquesne University


In 1922, Walter Lippmann and John Dewey engaged in a debate about the role of public deliberation in forming public policy. Lippmann was skeptical of ordinary citizens' ability to have the acuity needed for making complex policy, while Dewey argued that properly regulated public deliberation among ordinary citizens could yield sound decisions. Such deliberation, Dewey claimed, is needed to determine the common good that is at stake in a particular policy. The more pluralistic the society, the more such deliberation is needed.

Now, nearly a century later, Dewey's vision continues to inspire. In October 2009 Jürgen Habermas, Charles Taylor, Judith Butler, and Cornel West, in a public forum in New York City's Cooper Union (sponsored by New York University, Stony Brook University, and the Social Science Research Council), each addressed one of the thorniest current topics of public deliberation: its incorporation of religious thought. Until the work of Rawls, little philosophical discussion had targeted the role of religion in the public sphere. But now, as Eduardo Mendieta and Jonathan VanAntwerpen point out in their Introduction to the volume, even in the face of increasing technological development and modernization, religion has not "withered away," and thus an analysis of its role in public deliberation repays renewed exploration (4).

Habermas, appropriately, begins the debate. He is widely acknowledged as the most influential living architect of the role and importance of the public sphere: the secular realm of "rational-critical debate in which matters of the public good are considered" (132). He assumes each citizen has the obligation to make contributions to a democratic process in order to reach collective decisions. He has consistently argued that the public sphere cannot be governed on purely secular principles. But only recently has he given serious thought to the role of religion in what he now calls a "postsecular" public sphere. Religion ought to contribute not only to the understanding of the origins of the public sphere but also to providing it "semantic potentials" on the grounds of which new social and political policies can be imagined.

Habermas builds his argument in his lecture by criticizing Carl Schmitt's notion of "the political." Schmitt believed that the twentieth century rise of liberalism and its attendant emphasis on normative democratic will-formation effectively negated genuine politics. In contrast, Schmitt wanted a return to a sovereign state power, exercised not through reason but primarily through a charismatic leader. (Thus, in a way, Schmitt's dismissal of public deliberation plays for Habermas the role that Lippmann did for Dewey.) This sovereign form of power embodies in an authentic way the religious roots of all political authority. Like Rawls, Habermas thinks that in modernity politics did in fact migrate from the sovereign to civil society, which now functions on the basis of the public use of reason. But he thinks civil society should nonetheless refer to religious sources if they are "translated" in a way secular persons can understand. Habermas is concerned that this ought not, however, to place a greater burden on the religious persons to carry out this translation. Instead, nonreligious persons must, for their part, realize the limits of secular reason and be open to the "truth content" of vibrant world religions. (Butler agrees that what is translated from the religious can "continue to resonate" in the secular (112).) So, we jettison Schmitt's notion of sovereignty but retain his hope for a continued substantive form of association between politics and religion.

Taylor situates his argument about the relation between politics and religion in the context of his analysis of secularism. He suggests that the French revolution's notions of liberty, equality, and fraternity can serve as a model for conceptualizing the "goods" of secularism. Many secular states have functioned well within this general scheme. How can this inform our current thinking about issues in the public sphere? Taylor takes up the recent prohibition of Islamic women from wearing the hijab in public schools in France and Germany. He points out that in such matters a distinction generally is made between secular and religious modes of assessment. The secular is supposed to avoid commerce with religious claims and focus only on the commitment of the democratic society to diversity. For Taylor, however, diversity resists privileging not only one religion over another, but also one cultural or intellectual viewpoint over another. A state ought to develop its identity over time on the basis of a "revisionary polysemy" of various doctrines and ways of thinking (56). So rather than pit religious against nonreligious, secular, or atheistic viewpoints, the state ought to be "neutral" among all of these views -- even if one of them is Kantian, Marxist, or utilitarian. One should not fetishize one basic principle -- be it either laïcité in the French case of the hijab or nonreligiously informed reason in the idealized analysis of Habermas and Rawls -- but recognize a genuine plurality of principles. Taylor realizes, however, that this depends on the people's ability to act in mutual commitment and trust so as to form a collective identity -- a tall order. Nonetheless, it is allowable that the collective identity built from this neutrality may take on "quasi sacred status" (46).

In his response to Taylor, Habermas rebuffs the claim that secular and religious thinking have equal status as operative principles in the public sphere. Unlike its secular counterparts, religious reasoning requires "membership in a community of believers" and participation in some kind of cultic practice (61). Thus its range of extension is intrinsically more limited than the secular. Taylor, in response, questions Habermas's implicit appeal to the presence of a "deeper experience" in religion. Martin Luther King's ostensibly religious message about the principles of the United States constitution could be understood broadly without any appeal to such restricted experience or practice. Habermas replies that any putative neutrality about principles of politics or persuasion inextricably relies upon an underlying rational consensus about political essentials. Moreover, in the public sphere religious citizens in fact know "in advance" that certain of their arguments cannot be understood by all citizens without translation.

Butler shifts the debate by focusing on a specific current conflict between secular and religious principles in the public sphere: the debate concerning the Israeli state's violence towards Palestinians within its borders. She first points out that the basic form of secular thinking has itself been, at least in the case of the United States, essentially religious: a form of Protestantism. From this viewpoint, "secularism may be a fugitive way for religion to survive" (72). A difficulty arises when those of different religions need to coexist in the same secular state. In response, she appeals not to a principle of toleration but rather "cohabitation" as central to the public order, noting that it has roots precisely in certain diasporic traditions within Judaism. She was persuaded by Walter Benjamin's idea that humanity's oppression and dispossession can be redeemed through an awareness of the ubiquity of diasporic exile: we are all involved in some way in a disruption of "teleological history and an opening to a convergent and interruptive set of temporalities" (81). All peoples share in this exilic status, and thus are equally cohabitants. Taylor later comments in similar existential fashion that, "We are given to each other. We can't choose" (111). But cohabitation is not meant to homogenize peoples; rather, "the commitment to equality is a commitment to the process of differentiation" (85). For Butler, an awareness of the particular past sufferings of each individual and group becomes an ethics of memory, which is a fundamental condition for the process of pluralization.

Sitting alongside these three whom he calls "the towering European philosopher in the house, the towering North American philosopher, and the leading social theorist of the time," West calls himself "a blues man" and "a jazzman in the world of ideas" (92). Thus he takes up a more aesthetic position regarding the self-understanding of the citizen regarding religion. He thinks that philosophy must "go to school with poetry" (93). Secular thinkers need to become more religiously musical; religious thinkers need to become secularly musical. But such poetics ought to draw also from the Jewish prophetic tradition. Jesus did this himself, as when he preached the love of enemies. West says that the religious person, like all persons, has to live in the "gap" between ideals and what is real. Such persons need God and "all the various stories that try to keep us honest" (108). But the prophet, who "keeps track of catastrophe," goes further (111). He or she must have the courage to fail in this mission. The truly prophetic person is not just in solidarity with dominated peoples but should have "a genuine love and willingness to celebrate with and work alongside those catching hell" (96). Thus this puts into question President Obama's "charismatic version of American exceptionalism" that fails to affirm the oppression of indigenous people (100). West thinks all persons can draw a new poetics of empathy and imagination that can grasp and draw inspiration from "utopian interruptions."

The final section of the debates is an interaction, guided by Mendieta and Craig Calhoun, among all four participants. When asked if her position is applicable to non-Jews, Butler replies that central to any ethics of citizenship is precisely the relation between citizen and non-citizen. Regarding her Benjamin-inspired "ethics of memory," Mendieta asks whether that would force us constantly to look backwards and give up on a theory of progress. She replies that, as Benjamin notes, the past flashes occur in the now: the Jetztzeit. These insights can be translated into the liberation of the present. But the religious talk that emerges has to avoid idolatry, maintaining some kind of gap between its ideals and reality. Still, accounts of universality, equality, and cohabitation can never be extracted fully from the religious ideals whence they arise. She insists that alterity, not what is common, lies at the basis of ethics. Taylor amplifies this, concluding that translation involves holding onto the nonidentical without reducing it to a pure neutrality. It can guide deliberation in a number of diverse situations.

It is difficult to assess a debate that took up such a singular but complex topic and exhibited such a positive rapport among the discussants. The gathering was more of a collective inquiry than a push for right answers. Little disagreement was left by the end, save perhaps Habermas's criticism of Taylor's posit of epistemic parity between religious and secular reasoning. So I will instead point out only some issues involving the role of religion in the public sphere that were omitted in this brief debate.

One noticeable lacuna lies in the question of how a religiously enhanced public deliberation then translates from the public sphere into the legal order. Is legal terminology to have the same receptivity as the public sphere to translations from religious discourse? More specifically, while legal ideals such as justice, fairness, and equality arguably have religious inspiration, are there forms of legal reasoning that come from religious forms of reason? If so, could they be translated as well? If so, what might they be?

Another significant issue, which all four have alluded to in other writings, is the problem of religious extremism. What happens when extremists gain a critical mass of public influence? Will these public sphere arguments convince them to change? What do we do with those who stubbornly resist Butler's cohabitation principle and resist any respect for the public sphere as such? Does a form of West's prophetic love of enemies and the suffering this could entail become the only viable response? Can Taylor's public sphere remain neutral with regard to principles that steer towards violence?

A third concern would question why all four discussants described public discourse as operating in a highly cognitive fashion: as stemming from individual participants who valued and carried out public actions from conscious and rational motives. Can a stipulation of this sort extend beyond the bounds of Western academic culture? How would it apply, for example, to persons involved in recent mass uprisings in Egypt, Bahrain, Syria, and even Libya? Certainly these were political acts, both communal and effective, but they were arguably guided as much by emotional reactions as by cognitive understandings on the part of the participants.

The four discussants might, however, argue that their models of public participation are not meant to apply to all political situations of all peoples at all times. Moreover, they could rightly claim that the citizenry of much of the world has not only been aided by the development of ideals of public deliberation but also has benefitted from discussions -- such as theirs -- of how such ideals should undergo modifications to adapt to continually new social, and in this case religious, conditions.