The Power of Tolerance: A Debate

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Wendy Brown and Rainer Forst, The Power of Tolerance: A Debate, Luca di Blasi and Christoph F. E. Holzhey (eds.), Columbia University Press, 2014, 107pp., $15.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231170192.

Reviewed by Peggy H. Breitenstein, Philipps-Universität Marburg


This book documents a discussion between Wendy Brown and Rainer Forst about tolerance and -- as the title indicates -- about the connection of power and tolerance. It took place as part of the series "Spannungsübung" ("tension exercise") at the Berlin Institute for Cultural Inquiry (ICI) in December 2008. The objective of this series is to make space for productive tensions in various manners: in focusing on controversial problems such as tolerance, it turns central tensions of our present into subjects of fruitful confrontations between different approaches or discussants.

Brown and Forst are outstanding scholars as well as authors of important books on this ambiguous term, which also expresses an ideal of the Western political and social practice. But they have different theoretical backgrounds and use different methods. Brown refers back to Foucault and his discourse-power analysis whereas Forst draws upon Critical Theory and Habermasian discourse ethics. So, Brown's Regulating Aversion (Princeton University Press, 2006) particularly focuses on the discursive uses of tolerance by liberalisms. The aim of her genealogical critique is to show how this discourse of tolerance constructs and positions social identities as well as liberal and non-liberal subjects. She examines the limited, asymmetrical, normalizing aspects of this discourse and criticizes the effect of de-politicization, which means that the tolerance discourse masquerades the social powers that are constitutive of difference. In his voluminous work Toleration in Conflict (Cambridge University Press, 2013, an abridged version of the German edition, published 2003), on the other hand, Forst as a "Frankfurter" offers a conceptual analysis as well as a grand dialectical story about the history of the Western discourse of toleration from antiquity to the twentieth century (to Wendy Brown) and also develops his own normative theory of toleration.

The really good, often humorous dialogue between the two leading theorists of tolerance is deeply influenced by these works but also understandable for "beginners" because it offers a short and clear overview of their central arguments. After an opening by Antke Engel, the volume (and debate) starts with short inputs by Brown and Forst (pp. 11-32). The discussion that follows focuses on various topics: the question of subject constitution, the importance and ambivalence of the discourse and practices of toleration in contemporary society, and the tensions between tolerance as political discourse, as a form of governance and as a strategy of de-politicization. The volume closes with an epilogue by Luca Di Blasi and Christoph F. E. Holzhey (pp. 71ff.) that sheds light on the background of the discussion between Brown and Forst, especially by providing important information on the concept itself whose meaning fluctuates so widely, on the famous so-called "tolerance paradox", on some ideas that Brown and Forst developed in their main books, and on controversial aspects of the debate. This epilogue is also an illuminating introduction for readers without knowledge of the field or, in particular, of the basic premises and methods of genealogical and critical theory of tolerance.

Brown and Forst offer short overviews of problems and main arguments of their works on tolerance, and also of possible tensions. But it is a surprise that, prima facie, there are no fundamental disagreements about the concept, about the criticized effects of the discourse of tolerance or about the constitutive connection between this discourse and power. Both theorists -- as Brown first declares -- neither disagree about the "richness, complexity, and variation in the term as both as a concept and a practice," nor about the reversibility of its operations that are "sometimes emancipatory, sometimes subordinating, sometimes both at once," nor about the "appreciation of tolerance as a nested notion or practice" that does not simply reduce conflicts, that can only be understood in specific social and historical contexts and that is always wedded to power (pp. 13f.; see also pp. 24, 26, 31f.). Both underline the necessity of deconstruction and critique of existing discourses of tolerance that reify identities, produce disciplined subjects and have tendencies of hegemonization, ontologization and re-naturalization of religious, racial, and cultural differences and conflicts (pp. 19f., 22f., 30ff., 77f.).

This much they share. Nonetheless, it is not difficult to see the disagreements and their deeper causes.

The first differences are their goals and methods. More exactly: without a clear exposition of the relevant concepts, Brown focuses her critical analysis on the production of power and domination in contemporary normative discourses about tolerance in politics and cultural life, discourses "that circulate from state to society, to individual to neighborhood association" (17f.), discourses whose objects are ethnicities, sexualities, cultures, and discourses that "do not just refer to, but constitute political identities," not least the "identity of the West as a tolerant civilization" (18). It's a skeptic's point of view, but Brown offers persuasive contemporary examples and the possibility of their deconstruction: the homophobe who states "I'm against gay marriage but I'm for tolerance," the declaration of the election of Obama as a triumph of tolerance, e.g., by the New York Times (2008), the project of sanctifying Israel and demonizing Palestine by the Museum of Tolerance (in Los Angeles, New York, Jerusalem), the association of tolerance with the problem of immigrants in Europe, the identification of the history of Western liberal democracy with tolerance, the identification of Islamic culture with intolerance (pp. 18f.). These examples indicate the presence of disciplining fixations of identities in contemporary multicultural societies, the differentiation between normal and un-normal identities and the cultural devaluation, but also a de-politicization of real conflicts in the name of tolerance. This view and Brown's genealogies may help to reconfigure the way we think about and open our eyes to the other side of liberalism's discourse of tolerance.

Forst, by contrast, uses an elaborate concept and a difference of various conceptions of toleration as arguments. The concept has three characteristics: an objection component (the tolerated beliefs or practices must be considered as wrong or bad, not only as strange), an acceptance component (that gives certain positive reasons why the wrong beliefs or practices ought to be tolerated) and a rejection component (that specifies certain limits of toleration) (pp. 23f.). On the base of this general understanding of the concept, Forst distinguishes between a "permission conception" and a "respect conception" of toleration. "The permission conception is the classic one that, in a certain sense, still holds us captive" (p. 25). It is a hierarchical conception that rests on arbitrary rules, which for the history of theory and social practice has been its dominant form: toleration here means that an authority or majority defines a minority (produces a subject), and determines what the tolerated minority are allowed to do, or not (p. 26). This conception is dialectic in the sense that it has liberating effects because the tolerated minority enjoys a certain security. But it has also repressive effects because this policy of toleration produces "stigmatized, 'non-normal' identities that are, at the same time, included and excluded" (p. 26). The respect conception of tolerance, by contrast, is grounded in a mutual respect of the tolerating and the tolerated individuals or groups as autonomous or as equal, and in an acceptance of the right to justification in particular of the rule to which the tolerated individuals are subjected (p. 27f.). This conception implies a dynamic of demanding mutually acceptable reasons for subjections and, therefore, a liberating power as well.

With these conceptions and this distinction, Forst intends to deconstruct and criticize the current discourse of toleration wherever it is intolerant or violates the right of justification or of democratic justice, wherever the identity production is hegemonic. But the conceptions also allow -- and this is another difference to Brown's negative approach -- to formulate certain examining rules for a tolerant democratic citizen and for a tolerant democratic ethos.

Tolerance is a way of the reflecting on whether your reasons for objecting to a practice that you think is wrong are sufficient to reject that practice if you were a law-making citizen. . . . The art of toleration is an art of finding proper reasons that can be presented to others when you think that they should conform to a norm that they don't agree with in their practices and beliefs. It consists in distinguishing your reasons for objection from mutually justifiable reason for rejection. The latter have a higher threshold of justification. (p. 31)

Last but not least, Forst's conception allows drawing a distinction between the private and the public and avoiding the problem of de-politicization. The justification of tolerance or intolerance implies the criteria of reciprocity and generality, which are criteria of the public and political in democratic societies and not (only) of the private realm. This conception is also normative; it requires proper reasons or good justifications in public discourses and their implementation in institutions. On individual, social and political levels, tolerance thus offers means for enduring tensions, for living with differences and conflicts, and for reducing assimilation as well as discrimination.

Therefore, it seems that the tension between Forst and Brown is based on this distinction, in particular on the acceptance or non-acceptance of the respect conception. But the deeper difference or incompatibility between Forst and Brown is that, with the later Foucault, Forst accepts a productive (and therefore dialectical in a proper sense) dimension of power that works in self-identifications of individuals and groups in the private and public realm. Brown does not., Power, therefore, is always repressive in her eyes, and a production of "relatively neutral subjects" seems possible only in the non-political, private realm (the "Lebenswelt" in German). In Brown's view, a positive notion of tolerance is restricted to benign differences, to morally irrelevant beliefs and practices, to aesthetics or to emotional aversions (pp. 34f.). So, Brown focuses her critique on the external production of identities in the public realm, yet Forst is also interested in a rationalization of the "first-person perspective" (p. 45). In this way, he can call for 'desubjugation' in existing social and political practices. He refers directly to Foucault's characterization of the critical attitude -- the "not to be governed like that" -- and interprets it as a polemical challenge to intolerant practices or regimes that calls for a good or better justification (p. 32). Therefore, Forst's conception of tolerance is really dialectical, or "a multi-stable figure," in the words of the editors (pp. 77ff.). He offers a critical theory of contemporary relations of toleration; Brown's conception, by contrast, is negative and offers a negative dialectic of tolerance.

But the two projects are complementary and enable continual, mutual corrections. This may be the most important insight the dialogue offers for advanced readers, too. Therefore, unlike the Foucault-Habermas debate, this debate is not an unproductive one.