The Powers Metaphysic

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Neil E. Williams, The Powers Metaphysic, Oxford University Press, 2019, 256pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198833574.

Reviewed by Anna Marmodoro, Durham University


What does Neil E. Williams' new book add to the on-going (and fast-going!) development of metaphysics of powers, on which so much has been written already? Among the most novel and attractive features of Williams' work is its earnest engagement in the project of understanding what the opponents -- the neo-Humeans -- hold. Rarely do those who are in one camp invest effort in giving a fair presentation of opposing camps; whilst Williams devotes two of his ten chapters to clarify what is at stake in the debate between 'friends' and 'enemies' of powers in terms of their respective worldviews. Further, and in the same vein, Williams devotes a chapter to discussing the most well-known objections to powers, the virtus dormitiva objection. Even if fellow travellers of Williams -- the friends of powers -- might not need be reminded why their direction of travel is a good one, they will find it rewarding to read Williams' fair-minded discussion of potential objections. Those who are not fellow travellers are likely to feel more interested in a metaphysics of powers if they see that their objections are given due consideration. Kudos to Williams for trying to create a framework for discussion between two opposing camps. Also novel in Williams' project are the arguments to show that endorsing (his) powers metaphysic has explanatory benefits in relation not only to our understanding of causation (for which all friends of powers argue), but also to another core problem in philosophy: the persistence of material objects. As in any book review, it is impossible to do justice to all Williams' fresh and thought-provoking ideas. His writing style deserves praise, too, for clarity, being engaging, and a pleasure to read. I will select only some of the issues that I hope will spark the reader's interest in further engagement with his work.

Williams' ontology is rich. One might even say too rich, in the sense that it remains unclear why it needs to be so complex and what exactly some of its elements are, metaphysically. Let us start with the very familiar example of fragility: Williams admits it in his ontology as a bona fide entity, and classifies it as a disposition. But 'underneath' fragility, there are "even more basic dispositions, which underlie solubility, fragility, and so on" (p. 47); and these are the powers that Williams' powers metaphysic is about. (The reader will want to ask: What is the metaphysical explanation of what is here referred to, neutrally, as 'underlying'? Williams does not tell us.) What are powers then? It turns out that there is something 'underlying' them too; each power is a 'set of abilities':

A power is that object's ability to bring about those states of affairs. Each power is thus a set of such abilities, as any power is capable of bringing about a variety of different states according to what circumstances it finds itself in. (p. 49)

(Perhaps then powers are a free lunch on the set of abilities that somehow constitute them? But then, is it the power, or the abilities that constitute it that are causally efficacious?). What are abilities? Williams says: "aspects of powers". What are "aspects of powers"? "Ways objects are", which exist even if they remain unmanifested (p. 50). But the ways objects are, are the properties of objects. So why posit the extra ontological layers of aspects, abilities, powers, and further, dispositions? The relations between the layers remain unclear.

Williams' ontology is even richer than I have presented so far. Powers belong to 'networks'; networks of co-manifesting powers are 'constellations' (as per the identity claim of networks and constellations on p. 51.) Constellations are "nothing more than localised arrangements of other powers" which are "the circumstances in which powers are exercised" (p. 49). Constellations thus appear to be the manifestation conditions for powers, cashed out in a group of manifestation partners (arranged in a certain way). Are the 'arrangements' somehow metaphysically emergent entities? If so, they need further explanation; if not, what kind of entity are they, in William's ontology, since they play a role in the manifestation of powers?

Further, constellations do more metaphysical work for Williams than merely enabling powers to manifest. Williams holds that "Powers are properties whose natures are determined holistically" (p. 88). But here things become complex, and, I am afraid, obscure. Williams holds that "a power's position in the network corresponds directly to its identity" (p. 52); and "It is the selfsame property doing all these different things as part of different constellations" (p. 80). How can the same power be part of different constellations if the "power's position in the network [constellation] corresponds directly to its identity"? If the position in the network determines the identity of the powers (if this is what "corresponds directly" means for Williams), a power cannot change its network and still be the same power. (Aristotle explained why, and holism requires it.)

Williams is alert to this theoretical tension in his system, and adds: "But I deny that this network is what (strictly) determines the identity of a power" (p. 52, f. 13). "Corresponds directly" and "strictly determines" are metaphysically loose expressions. Williams elucidates:

The account of power individuation I defend is an atypical form of power holism . . . Power holism is the view that the identities (natures) of power types are determined by their places in a complicated structure. The structure is made up of a series of relations holding between: the power types; the sorts of manifestations each power type is for; the other power types that must be instantiated (and in what configuration) for those manifestations to arise (constellations); and the constellations by which the power type may be produced . . . The holism I defend . . . does not demand that the structure, or the relations that form it, be genuine existents. (p. 85)

At this point some readers may have lost track of where we started, in terms of fundamentality: what is it to be a genuine existent, and what are the genuine existents among what populates William's ontology? What are the remaining items in the ontology that are non-genuine existents? What is foundational? (Note also that the ontology seems further inflated by now, with structures, and relations too.) Williams acknowledges some unease: "That might sound a little odd, given the role the structure plays in fixing the essences of the powers" (p. 85, my emphasis); and says: "just be warned that when I speak of the 'structure' the powers form, I am speaking quasi-metaphorically" (p. 86). This does not help metaphysical understanding.

I turn now to how Williams conceives of the nature of his powers. His view is surely original, and this is to be appreciated. He calls it "mixed monism". He writes: "a property's powerfulness does not exhaust its nature. There is more to a property than just being powerful. Not much more, to be sure, but nonetheless: all properties are an uneven mixture of power and non-powerful quality" (p. 46); elsewhere, "amalgams" (p. 114).

The properties of mixed monism are properties that live a double life. That double life is at once powerful and qualitative and both aspects constitute the essence of the mixed properties . . . Neither aspect is such that it can be understood in terms of the other, nor can one aspect be reduced to the other. Both sides are equally fundamental. It is clear enough that a property's dual-aspect requires a union of the powerful and the qualitative within a single property . . . Dual-aspect properties are composite . . . They are composite in the way the concrete particulars include properties but are not just collections of properties. (p. 113)

The fundamental problem I find in Williams' account of powers is the following. It is clear why he wants to divide the qualitative from the dynamic aspect of a power, since thereby he can easily explain what remains always, even when a power is not manifesting -- the qualitative aspect of a power is always present. However, this stance is problematic. When a power manifests, its impact on the world (i.e., the change it brings about) is qualitative. If not (i.e., if change does not bring about a qualitative difference in the world) Williams owes us an account of change. Assuming that change does bring about a qualitative difference in the world, the problem with Williams' solution is that the ontology he proposes does not allow the qualitative aspect of a (dual-aspect) power to have anything to do with the qualitative impact (change) the power brings about when it manifests. This is a serious problem for Williams' ontology.

Calling a property 'dual-aspect' or 'composite' is asking the question, not answering it, and, by the way, it is asking very different questions, and using very different analogies for the property's constitution. In the last sentence of the quotation above, Williams gestures towards explaining compositeness in terms of emergence in particulars. If we are to think that the inert and the powerful in a power emerge as a single entity, i.e., as the (dual-aspect) property, I want to emphasise here that this cannot render the qualitative impact of the powerfulness of the property dependent on the qualitative nature of the inert aspect of the property. Emergence cannot 'transfer' the nature of the inert into the nature of the powerful's impact.

For Williams, powerfulness and qualitative character jointly compose the essence of mixed properties. "The relationship between the two sides of the mixed monist's properties is a surprising necessity" (p. 118). Necessity explains the modality, which Williams sees between the powerfulness and the qualitative character of a power. However, the relation between the natures of these two is a wholly different kettle of fish. One gets the distinct impression that Williams thinks of powerfulness as if it were (metaphorically speaking) a neutral spring, which attaches to the qualitative aspects of properties and by which they become powers. But there are no such metaphysically neutral springs, and thinking there are misses all there is to the conception of a power. First, we cannot turn an inert qualitative state into a power by somehow 'attaching' something dynamic to it. Williams seems to want the inert to also be dynamic. Second, even if this could per impossibile be achieved, what would the relation be between the quality of the manifestation of such a power and its qualitative base? And why? How can any such claim be justified? Things become even more complicated if we assume that Williams means that the manifestation of a power has a qualitative character of its own, different from the qualitative base of its causal power. Putting this into Williams' ontology, how is it that the powerfulness of a power manifests into a different power that has an altogether different qualitative character? If constellations can achieve this feat, how exactly do they do their metaphysical work?

As do all of us in the business of developing a metaphysics of powers, Williams holds that powers may or may not manifest (and he takes the manifestation of a power -- within a constellation -- as the production or generation of new powers: "Powers beget powers", p. 52). But he denies the distinction (which I, as a disclaimer, endorse, as per his fn. 22 p. 128) between active and inactive powers:

There is simply no good sense in which some powers are active and others inactive. Inasmuch as we can say that any is active when they produce a manifestation, they all are. But we should nevertheless avoid speaking this way, because there is no time at which power is 'switched on' to a different sort of state. (p. 128)

we should never speak as if 'being active' captures a genuine way that powers can be. In fact, there is something quite odd about thinking of a power as having a different status like this . . . this [Marmodoro's] is an instantiated property having different ways than it is, owing to what powers it is partnered with . . . change in status must be a property of the power properties. I, for one, can make little sense of powers bearing properties like this. (p. 129)

We hereby learn that Williams has excised activity from his world. There is change, but there is no activity. (Recall the familiar Always Packing, Never Travelling Argument (Armstrong 1997).) Change for Williams consists in the popping up of new entities that make up different totalities (that he calls constellations), but I don't believe that explains anything. I, for one, do not recognise such a world and I want my metaphysics to be able to explain activity as well as change. There is an important point about the difference between powers in potentiality (inactive) and manifesting powers (active, in my terminology) that I want to explain here. Williams thinks that there is no difference at all between them, but . . . magically, novel powers pop up when powers in potentiality find themselves in certain circumstances. What a metaphysician must understand here is that being dynamic is not magic. Rather, and this is what I want to stress, being dynamic involves difference, and difference has to be explained. If a power is dynamic, it is the power itself that embodies this difference, not its environment (with powers suddenly popping up), since it is the power that is dynamic. This difference in a dynamic entity is what Aristotle explained by differentiating between the potentiality and the activation of a power; Williams explains it by claiming that in some environments nothing happens around a power, while in other environments new powers pop up. This is not an explanation of dynamism.

Of the two ways Williams puts his powers to work, causation and objects' persistence, I will focus on the former. Once again, I have no option but to be selective; so, I will concentrate on one issue only: Williams' denial of simultaneous causation (p. 171), which, in contrast, many powers metaphysicians have come to endorse. He writes,

If a cause perfectly overlaps its effect in time, then the rejection of change is precisely what follows. If the very powers that jointly give rise to the manifestation must themselves be the manifestation -- as [C.B.] Martin indicates -- then change is impossible. No powers can be lost or gained as a result of those selfsame powers interacting. It follows that this model is untenable. (p. 170)

Why does Williams generalise that Martin's view is necessarily what all friends of powers would endorse? Martin's famous example is that of two pieces of paper, each cut in the shape of a triangle, that are put together into a square: the pieces of paper are partner powers and the square their manifestation. There are many reasons to object to Martin's view (a number have been published), and mine is that Martin takes emergence to exhaust all types of causation. But the point here is that it seems wrong to take (without further argument) Martin's view to be the only view that those who believe in simultaneous causation can adopt to explain it. If anything, the outcome that Williams describes shows that Martin's view is wrong, rather than that simultaneous causation is impossible.

My concluding thought is that even those who will disagree with Williams on some aspects of his view will find his book thought-provoking, and will want to respond and thus push the development of the metaphysics of powers even further. May the power be with us.