The Powers of Aristotle's Soul

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Thomas Kjeller Johansen, The Powers of Aristotle's Soul, Oxford University Press, 2012, 376pp. $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199658435.

Reviewed by Caleb Cohoe, Metropolitan State University of Denver


Thomas Kjeller Johansen presents Aristotle as the father of faculty psychology, the "attempt to account for the multitude of psychological phenomena by reference to a few permanent or inborn psychological capacities." (1) Johansen offers a unified interpretation of the De Anima (DA) on which Aristotle is the first to systematically explain the full variety of living activities in terms of a limited number of constitutive capacities that define the soul. Aristotle defines the soul and explains the activities of living things by laying out three defining capacities of the soul: nutrition, perception, and intellect. He then uses these three fundamental capacities to account for further abilities such as locomotion and imagination (phantasia).

Johansen's work makes a significant contribution to our understanding of capacities and the soul in Aristotle and to our overall understanding of the DA. His interpretations are always carefully developed and show an excellent grasp of Aristotle's entire corpus, helpfully bringing in relevant texts from other works to illuminate both particular claims made in the DA and its overall method. I would recommend this work for all scholars working on Aristotle or on ancient understandings of powers or the soul. It may also prove of interest for those in contemporary philosophy who are working on the notion of powers (for example, Johansen's discussion in chapter 4 of how Aristotle specifies capacities and what explanatory work capacities do should prove informative and helpful to anyone interested in capacities). Johansen's focus, however, is on giving a consistent and well worked out interpretation of Aristotle's theory on its own terms.

I will now summarize some of the key claims Johansen makes and note a few important places where I either disagreed with Johansen or wanted further evidence or explication. In chapter 1, he discusses Aristotle's procedure for defining the soul and examines how the characterizations of the soul in DA II.1 fit with each other. He focuses on a puzzle that arises from Aristotle's claim that the bodies of living things are potentially alive: surely the living body must have life actually and not just potentially? Using texts from both the DA and the Metaphysics, Johansen carefully shows that Aristotle thinks of matter as that which is able to be determined by the relevant form. Thus on Johansen's reading Aristotle can speak of the body, the matter of the living thing, as potentially alive, since it is only insofar as the soul determines it to be a living thing that it actually lives. To my mind, Johansen's interpretation clearly shows that functionalist or materialist readings are mistaken. Aristotle does not think that the soul is merely a useful way of talking about abilities the body already possesses.

In chapter 2 Johansen explains how the definition of the soul can serve as a principle of demonstration according to the model presented in the Posterior Analytics. This requires the soul to possess a high level of unity, and so in chapter 3 Johansen discusses how we can understand the soul to have parts while still being sufficiently unified. On his interpretation, Aristotle does not think that every distinct psychic capacity counts as a part of the soul. Instead, parts of the soul are those capacities that can be defined separately from other parts and also serve as the defining part of the relevant kind of soul.[1] For example, the perceptive part's definition makes no reference to the nutritive part and the perceptive part is the defining part of one kind of soul, perceptive soul. However, Johansen does not do enough to account for the unity of the whole soul with its parts. For example, he seems to think that Aristotle's definition of animal soul mentions both the perceptive capacity and the nutritive capacity, raising the question of how these capacities are unified. Johansen holds that if we understand the nutritive capacity as matter in relation to the perceptive capacity as form, the animal soul will have the appropriate unity. While Johansen notes that Aristotle employs such a strategy when discussing the unity of genus and species in Metaphysics H, he does not do enough to show that the form-matter relationship applies to the case of the nutritive and perceptive capacities. Even if this does work for the animal soul, Johansen would also need to provide an account of why the nutritive and perceptive capacities can be seen as matter in relation to the intellectual capacity, something he does not attempt.

In chapter 4 Johansen maintains that the capacities of the soul are to be understood as inner principles for change, as the aspects of the living thing's nature that internally produce the sort of changes that living things' bodies undergo. According to Johansen, Aristotle easily avoids Moliere's famous virtus dormitiva caricature of capacities, on which positing a capacity does nothing to explain the activity for which it is responsible. This is because the capacities, for Aristotle, serve as efficient, final, and formal causes of the changes they are capacities for: they give us an informative and non-vacuous explanation of why these changes occur.

In order to define capacities Aristotle claims we must understand their objects, an approach that Johansen seeks to explain in chapter 5. On his account the objects of the capacity are prior to the capacity itself because they are part of the formal cause, not because they are always efficient causes of the exercise of the capacity. Johansen argues that scholars have been misled on this point by focusing exclusively on perception; the clearer and more illustrative case is Aristotle's (oft-neglected) account of the nutritive soul. In the case of nutrition the nutritive soul is acting on the nutriment, so the nutriment is prior to it, not as a pre-existing efficient cause, but as the thing that defines and distinguishes it and gives it the form that it has. Johansen uses the notion of the object specifying the formal cause to address a problem about the unity of nutritive soul: it is supposed to be responsible for nutrition, growth, and generation, activities that each seem to have different objects and thus, by Aristotle's standards, seem to come from different capacities. Johansen argues that the object of the nutritive soul is the formal cause, the form of the living being in question, and that the activities of nutrition, growth, and generation all make essential reference to this form in such a way that we can see them as activities of the same part.

In chapter 6 Johansen offers further illuminating discussion of how nutrition serves as a paradigm for the soul as an efficient and final cause, before turning in chapter 7 to how the other parts of the soul, particularly the perceptive part, can serve as efficient causes. He concedes that because the soul in perception is passive, not active, it is not an efficient cause in a completely straightforward way. Nevertheless, he maintains that there is some sense in which the soul serves as an efficient cause because of its involvement in preparing the body to receive and process perceptible forms. While not entirely convinced by this discussion, I agree with Johansen in thinking that it is important for Aristotle's purposes that the perceptual capacity serve as an efficient cause in some way.

In chapter 8 Johansen examines how the soul, the formal and final cause of the living thing, and its activities relate to the body as the material cause. On Johansen's view the soul has definitional (if not existential) priority from the body and thus can be defined and discussed without mentioning the material cause (contra David Charles, who thinks the matter comes into the definition of the form itself, not just the composite).[2] Since in the DA Aristotle is focusing on defining the soul, the formal and final cause, and not on the body, the material cause, Johansen finds it unsurprising that Aristotle says little about the relevant material changes in this work.

Briefly touching on a much-disputed topic, Johansen argues that the kind of change formally involved in perception is a perfective change, a change to fulfillment, and not a straightforward material change. He then draws on the examples of Physics VII.3 to argue that perfective changes may hypothetically necessitate certain material changes, though these material changes need not be of the same kind as the perfective change. For example, the perfective change of a man coming into being (a substantial change) necessitates material changes that are of a different kind (heatings and coolings of the embryo that are alterations, not substantial changes). Based on these examples Johansen claims that perception may necessitate certain material changes, but that these material changes may be of a different kind and involve different attributes than the perfective changes they support. Aristotle need not maintain that the relevant material change for sight consists in some bodily part taking on a color (the eye changing from transparent to red, for instance); it may be of a different kind altogether. This to my mind is an intriguing path to pursue for those who want to avoid the extremes of the literalist and spiritualist interpretations of Aristotle's theory of perception. However, thinking of perception as a perfective change does not make clear whether any material changes accompanying perception are a unified part of the activity (as the movements of stones and wood are a unified material part of building a house) or necessary but separate preconditions (as sobering up is a necessary precondition of successfully contemplating). Johansen seems to prefer the former, but does little to elaborate or defend this interpretation.

In chapters 9-10 Johansen discusses how the perceptual capacity can explain not just perception of the special objects of the five senses, but all kinds of perception and imagination. Johansen claims that the capacity of the senses to discriminate between different kinds of perceptibles and recognize that perception is occurring are abilities that the five sense themselves possess, either individually or in combination with each other. The "common sense" that unifies the perceptions of the different senses is an aspect of these sense capacities, not a further fundamental kind of capacity. Johansen then works in chapter 10 to explain the role of phantasia (imagination) in animals and how it relates to perception. Johansen helpfully discusses how phantasia's ability to represent the contents of perception in ways that are more general than present perception is important for giving the animal with locomotion a target for desire to aim at, while also making phantasia less truth-apt than perception. He denies that phantasia should be thought of as a capacity or dunamis in the primary sense, since it is not an independent natural principle of change, given that its formal and efficient causes come from perception (since phantasia is caused by perception and phantasia's objects are perceptible objects, not a separate class of things) while its final cause is in terms of locomotion and perception (since its goal, on Johansen's reading, is to enable locomotive animals to more effectively use perception to direct their motions).

In chapter 11 Johansen turns to the nature and status of the intellectual capacity, which he understands as a capacity to grasp a logos, which can then be subdivided based on the kind of logos grasped. On the view Johansen favors, the undying active intellect of DA III 5 is the unmoved mover of Metaphysics L and not a capacity of the human soul, though he concedes that the passive intellect of III 4 is a capacity of the human soul. Nevertheless, on his view human intellectual activity doesn't essentially require a body: although thinking about enmattered things requires employing phantasia as a precondition, actively thinking about immaterial entities such as the divine being does not require any sort of phantasia or bodily process. This suggests that there is a capacity in the human soul itself that goes beyond the sphere of nature, raising further questions. Does this part of the human soul belong to nature at all? Can it still be a capacity of the soul? Does this mean that the soul or its intellective part is separable from the body? I would have liked to see Johansen do more to signal his awareness of these questions and sketch out the directions he would take on them.

In chapter 12 Johansen discusses DA III.9-10, focusing on the ways in which Aristotle thinks his account of the parts of the soul is better than the Platonic account. Aristotle requires that a capacity of the soul be definitionally separate (as opposed to merely different) to be counted as a fundamental part of the soul. Thus for Aristotle (but not for the Platonists) even though orexis (desire) is different in definition from reason or perception it is not separated off from them as a capacity because the object of desire (and thus the capacity) cannot be defined apart from them. Similarly, on Johansen's reading, locomotion, although it differentiates some animals from others, is not a fundamental capacity because it is not separable in definition from phantasia and thus not separable from perception.

Finally, in Chapters 13 and 14 Johansen examines how Aristotle employs the capacities of the soul in his other works of natural philosophy. Johansen rejects a simplistic picture on which the DA only treats of the soul while the other works bring in the role of the body in living activities. On Johansen's nuanced interpretation, material explanations and bodily features are discussed in the DA, but only insofar as they follow by hypothetical necessity from the definition of the soul's capacities. De Sensu, the Parva Naturalia, and the biological works provide further explanatory information about the role of the body insofar as it is a material cause of various features of living activities that do not directly follow from the definition of the soul's capacities. Johansen also works to resolve an apparent tension between the sort of holistic explanations of living behavior given in the biological works, explanations that involve the interaction of multiple capacities, and the modular descriptions given in the DA. Johansen convincingly argues that these holistic explanations are fully compatible with the DA's modular approach since they in fact rely on this basic modular understanding. Further, the contrasts between different animals that Aristotle makes based on these holistic explanations do not threaten the unity of the perceptual capacity since they are based on differences of intensity of perception, not on differences in the capacity itself or in its objects.

This book will be of great use to anyone seeking to understand Aristotle's conception of the soul and its capacities. It provides a helpful guide and foil when it comes to interpreting many of the key passages in the DA. Johansen's work also offers several interpretative strategies that I believe will be fruitfully explored and developed by scholars, such as his suggested approach to the changes involved in perception and his conception of how the DA relates to Aristotle's various biological works.

[1] As Johansen notes, his view is similar to the one independently developed in K. Corcilius and P. Gregoric (2012). "Separability vs. Difference: Parts and Capacities of the Soul in Aristotle." Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 39: 81-120.

[2] David Charles (2008), 9-10. "Aristotle's Psychological Theory," Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 24: 1-29. Johansen draws on Charles' work at a number of points, but on this issue their interpretations diverge.