The Practical Origins of Ideas: Genealogy as Conceptual Reverse-Engineering

The Practical Origins Of Ideas

Matthieu Queloz, The Practical Origins of Ideas: Genealogy as Conceptual Reverse-Engineering, Oxford University Press, 2021, 304pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198868705.

Reviewed by P J E Kail, University of Oxford


If one heard the word ‘genealogy’ in an Anglo-American philosophical context some 25 years ago, one’s thoughts would have tended to turn to Nietzsche, Foucault, and, perhaps, Alasdair Macintyre, together with notions like ‘subversion’ or ‘debunking’, and all would be coloured in a slightly ‘continental’, and thus marginal, tint. These days, however, genealogy—or rather particular interpretations of the term—has come to the fore in the Anglo-American mainstream. This is due, in no small measure, to Bernard Williams’s 2002 Truth and Truthfulness: An Essay in Genealogy.

Matthieu Queloz’s book is heavily influenced by Williams. It comprises the following. First, there are three chapters articulating the conception of genealogy with which Queloz operates. Second, there are two exegetical chapters, one on Hume, one on Nietzsche. Third, there are a trio of chapters on fairly recent works that exhibit genealogy so construed, one on Edward Craig, one on Miranda Fricker, and one on Williams. Finally, there is a chapter on the normative significance of genealogies and a short chapter that is a reflection on philosophy as such. Queloz’s prose is clear and the book is never dull, and it will be interesting to those working on methodological issues in contemporary philosophy. This is conspicuously the case in Queloz’s excellent discussion of Williams’s project of vindicating the intrinsic value of truth, defending it against objections based on a misunderstanding of Williams’s approach. But of course, the book is equally of interest to those who are interested in understanding ‘genealogy’ in a philosophical context and it is this which will be the focus of this review and the subject of some scepticism.

What makes a genealogy in Queloz’s sense is, first, that concepts or ideas are best approached not by analysis but in terms of their origins, or what it is that might explain why we have the concepts that we do. More precisely, Queloz’s conception of genealogy focuses on the practical origins of ideas. Pragmatic genealogy ‘consists in telling partly fictional, partly historical narratives exploring what might have driven us to develop certain ideas in order to discover what these ideas might do for us’ (2). Roughly—and very roughly, given we have little space—we model the emergence of a concept or idea by imagining how it serves the interests of those in a hypothesized situation who otherwise lack that concept, a situation which is characterized as a ‘state of nature’. This state is represented as temporally prior, but is in reality explanatorily prior, to the emergence of the concept. That is, the state and the needs are what explain the shape of the concept. It is a ‘pragmatic reconstruction’ (14). The dynamic aspect of such genealogies is its ‘historical’ component. That is when the account descends from the highly abstract paradigm account to factor in more local socially-historical needs to account for some of the more particular conceptual contours of some given idea. Such an elaboration represents a ‘later’ stage in the concept’s development, which means ‘less idealized’, rather than (necessarily) temporally later (16). This core notion is then employed in a number of different ways in the book. Queloz connects genealogy to the project of conceptual engineering by viewing genealogy as a form of ‘reverse engineering’. Whilst conceptual engineering asks what we want some particular concepts to do, genealogy illuminates what the concept does for us in order to provide a perspective on the engineer’s question of what we then want the concept to do. Furthermore, the dynamic nature of genealogy helps in understanding how some concept can be understood functionally, even when that function is ‘self-effacing’. Queloz then, in light of this conception of genealogy, reads the accounts of knowledge, given by Craig, the value of truth, given by Williams, and epistemic injustice, given by Fricker, defending each account against objections.

All of this is philosophically rich and interesting, and a real contribution to the present discussion. But Queloz also sees a tradition of pragmatic genealogy that stretches back before Williams, and here I remain unpersuaded. He situates his account somewhere between fictional state-of-nature stories such as those of Hobbes and Nozick and ‘historical and primarily explanatory genealogies of a Foucauldian stripe’ (5), though we should remember that the historical dimension in Queloz’s account is not really an attempt to show causal dependence/emergence but really another level of fictionalization which attempts to account for local specificity. Now, Queloz is prepared to call explicitly fictional state-of-nature stories ‘genealogies’ ‘insofar as they are development narratives’ (5) and of course anyone is allowed to use a word how they see fit. Nevertheless, the differences between the kinds of projects that, say, Nozick engages in Anarchy, State, and Utopia and what Nietzsche is up to in On the Genealogy of Morality might suggest that we could distinguish between state-of-nature accounts and genealogies, especially since the fictional character of such accounts contrasts starkly with Nietzsche’s insistence on ‘real history’. The former are fictional, and primarily vindicatory, stories whereas the latter are causal-explanatory accounts. What is more, state-of-nature accounts do seem closely and transparently tied to practical reason whereas the relationship between, say, Nietzsche’s account of Christian morality and practical reason is far more complex.

The word ‘genealogy’ does not matter by itself. One could be quite content to let the term ‘Williams-style genealogy’ refer to the project that Williams conducted—except for two things. First, given Williams’s prominence, a tendency has grown to take that conception of genealogy to be the dominant one and read it into places where it doesn’t belong (notedly, Nietzsche’s own On the Genealogy of Morality). Second, and most pertinent to this review, Queloz claims that there is a tradition of ‘pragmatic genealogy’ that stems from Hume up to the present day, and spends a considerable number of pages trying to find it in Hume and Nietzsche. Here I remain less than convinced.

First off, with the exception of Nietzsche, Hume, and, to a lesser extent, Craig,[1] all the accounts considered by Queloz borrow heavily from Williams’s own account of genealogy, the one that fits Queloz’s own conception. (Craig himself did not use the term ‘genealogy’ to describe the project in his 1990 Knowledge and the State of Nature, as Queloz recognizes (131n).) Furthermore, the invocation of Hume into this tradition is down to Williams’s own reading of Hume in Truth and Truthfulness, a reading which Queloz develops, which adds a further participant, namely the Basel-era Nietzsche. Do they nevertheless fit that tradition?

Queloz follows Williams in so doing by locating Hume’s account of justice as such a fictional genealogy, rejecting other readings that see Hume as offering a ‘conjectural history’ of the emergence, namely, a genuinely causal account that has the status of an inference to the best explanation. Queloz, like Williams, points to what seems to be a textual smoking gun, namely, Hume’s statement that the state of nature is ‘a mere philosophical fiction, which never had, and never could have reality’ (T Furthermore, as Queloz correctly points out, Hume writes that the ‘very first state and situation [of humanity] may justly be esteemed social’ (T, to which Queloz then adds the suggestion that justice is necessary to society. So the account must be of the fictional-cum-functional variety. But both Williams and Queloz make a key mistake here. When Hume is talking of the ‘state of nature’ he is referring to the Hobbesian view, which is ‘full of war, violence and injustice’. This ‘savage and solitary condition’ (T Hume rejects on the grounds that whatever advantages co-operative behaviour might offer could not possibly motivate social behaviour unless such an individual were ‘sensible of these advantages’, which he thinks an impossible feat for the solitary individual. Instead, humans naturally form families, where the first origin of society lies in ‘the natural appetite between the sexes’, which then leads to a ‘new tye’, namely, ‘a principle of union betwixt the parents and offspring, and forms a more numerous society’ (T It is in this sense that the natural condition is ‘social’. All of this, rather than the Hobbesian state of nature, is postulated as the starting point of Hume’s account of justice, which emerges as the co-operation between different family groups and thence to the establishment of conventions regulating property, which are distinctive of justice. Pace Queloz, this sense of ‘society’ is prior to justice. Hume doesn’t see this starting point as a fictional state of nature, but instead a plausible way to characterize the human condition prior to the establishment of justice and hence an ingredient in a causal-explanatory conjecture. Hume grants that other philosophers may indulge in a fictional state of nature because such a state does have humans with interests served by justice’s establishment, but that is very far from showing that Hume’s account is a fictional one.

Talking of interests, however, raise another issue. Queloz writes that such genealogies ‘paradigmatically aim to display instrumental dependencies: the ways in which conceptual practices are instrumental to the satisfaction of the concept-users’ needs’ (50, emphasis in original). State-of-nature accounts fit this bill perfectly, by showing that given the needs and interests one has, a certain practice, such as co-operation, serves to meet those needs and interests, thereby vindicating that practice. So although Hume’s account might not be fictional, it nevertheless involves instrumental dependencies: the establishment of such a convention serves the interests of those engaged in it. But notice that viewing things in that way involves abstracting away from other aspects of Hume’s account that don’t seem merely incidental, such as sexual attraction and procreation, as well as some relatively heavy-weight assumptions about psychology including sympathy and the moral sense, elements that, at the very least, seem to require much work to fit into relations between interests and instrumental strategies.

This brings us to Nietzsche, someone whom, as well as Williams, Queloz claims as a fellow traveller. Queloz focuses on early Nietzsche, and much of what he says here is perfectly true, if not new. He emphasizes Nietzsche’s observation that other philosophers lack a historical sense, exhibited, in particular, by their tendency to fail to see that concepts are a product of history. Furthermore, and correctly, he underlines Nietzsche’s criticism of the non-naturalistic strain in other philosophies. He notes, furthermore, in combining the two, that Nietzsche favours some form of natural selection. Concepts emerge because they exhibit some life-preserving or life-enhancing function. This is quite general for Nietzsche, and is, Nietzsche thinks, applicable to the most fundamental concepts like identity and substance. But none of this suggests that Nietzsche is offering some pragmatic genealogy in Queloz’s sense. Nietzsche is, in line with his engagement with contemporary life sciences, offering speculative causal accounts for the emergence of concepts; functional, yes, but not fictions aimed at conceptual articulation. So whilst I agree with Queloz that the accounts offered here are ‘imaginary’ (100), Queloz does nothing to convince me that that means they are deliberate fictions with the aim of conceptual articulation rather than speculative hypotheses with the aim of causal explanation. Notice also that such accounts differ with respect to the kind of intelligibility offered from the state-of-nature stories. Although such concepts are practically necessary, the story of acquisition is not that of some subject coming to awareness that a practice serves the particular ends she has. This of course doesn’t matter on a fictional account, but it is notable that Nietzsche offers not stories like that but causal stories instead. The same has to be said of Queloz’s nevertheless useful readings of Nietzsche’s accounts of the emergence of justice and truthfulness in his earlier work. These read as conjectural histories—attempts to explain causally—rather than pragmatic genealogies in Queloz’s sense.

With regard to Nietzsche’s On the Genealogy of Morality, Queloz notes a number of different things. First, that text represents a criticism of his earlier accounts under the guise of ‘English’ genealogies (a point made nicely by Christopher Janaway in his 2007 Beyond Selflessness), a criticism which has a number of different aspects. One is that what brought about some practice initially may not be identical to what sustains it in different times and circumstances (126). Second, the ‘English hypothesis-mongering’ is done in a completely ahistorical manner. But, as Queloz notes, and as others have noted, although Nietzsche does situate (some) aspects of his genealogy in a historical context, the account seems far from ‘the patiently documented history that Foucault . . . envisages’ (129). Quite so. But this doesn’t mean that genealogy is a mixture of the documented and the ‘imagined’ (130). Certainly Nietzsche’s explanation is simplified and abstract but that doesn’t prevent it being ‘real’ in the sense of a conjectural history or an inference to the best explanation. Furthermore, the notion of instrumental dependence, which seems transparent in state-of-nature accounts proper, seems problematic in Nietzsche’s own GM. First, one could view the slave revolt as a kind of tactic to achieve superiority and so instrumental in that sense, though as Williams himself notes this has to be understood in terms of the unconscious (and, we might add, the self-deceptive) and this Williams says raises problems (2002, 37). Second, key aspects of Nietzsche’s own genealogy such as the emergence of bad conscience do not seem amenable to instrumental dependence, let alone being represented as such by Nietzsche.

I remain therefore unpersuaded that Hume and Nietzsche share enough affinities with Williams’s own self-styled genealogy to show them to be fellow travellers. Nevertheless, for those interested in Williams’s project, and in methodology more generally, there is a tremendous amount to be learned from this very stimulating book.


Thanks to Christopher Fowles for comments on an earlier draft of this review.


Hume, David. A Treatise of Human Nature. David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds.). Oxford University Press, 2000. References are to book, part, section, and paragraph numbers.

Janaway, Christopher. Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche’s Genealogy. Oxford University Press, 2007.

Williams, Bernard. Truth and Truthfulness: An Essay in Genealogy. Princeton University Press, 2002.


[1] Craig’s own ‘practical explanation of knowledge’ owes something to the time when he and Williams were colleagues at Cambridge.