The Pragmatic Maxim: Essays on Peirce and Pragmatism

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Christopher Hookway, The Pragmatic Maxim: Essays on Peirce and Pragmatism, Oxford University Press, 2013, 256pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199588381.

Reviewed by Cheryl Misak, University of Toronto


Christopher Hookway is one of the very finest scholars of C.S. Peirce and the tradition he founded -- American pragmatism. In reading this latest collection of his essays, I am reminded of how much I have learned from him. (Full disclosure: I was his doctoral student.) These essays are required reading for anyone interested in Peirce or pragmatism. It is very good to have them collected in one volume, as some were published in hard-to-find venues. We are also treated to a magnificent introduction, which will serve as a primer for those who want to know the essentials. I am going to focus in this review on what I think are the most significant ways in which Hookway advances a sophisticated understanding of pragmatism. Other fans of Hookway will no doubt have their own favorites.

Pragmatism arose in the late 1860's in a reading group whose most prominent members were Peirce, William James, Oliver Wendell Holmes, and Chauncey Wright. The central insight of pragmatism is that in philosophy we must start from where we find ourselves -- as human beings, laden with beliefs and practices, trying to make sense of ourselves and our world. As Peirce's version of the pragmatic maxim has it, we must not adopt empty metaphysical theories. Rather, we must link our philosophical concepts to experience and practice -- to that with which we have "dealings".

When the pragmatist applies the maxim to the concept of truth, a set of problems immediately arises for the correspondence theory and any other theory that would make truth something that stood outside of human reach. How could anyone aim for a truth that goes beyond experience or beyond the best that inquiry could do? How could an inquirer adopt a methodology that might achieve that aim? The very idea of the believer-independent world, and the items within it to which beliefs might correspond or represent, seems graspable only if we could somehow step outside of our practices. The correspondence theory, Peirce says, is useless and "having no use for this meaning of the word 'truth', we had better use the word in another sense" (CP 5. 553). He argues that when we ask how truth is linked to our practices, we find that a true belief is one that would be "indefeasible"; or would not be improved upon; or would never lead to disappointment; or would forever meet the challenges of reasons, argument, and evidence. A true belief is the belief we would come to, were we to inquire as far as we could on a matter.

This view of truth has been much maligned, partly because on occasion Peirce says that truth is what we are fated to believe at the end of inquiry. Problems and counterexamples to this way of understanding pragmatism have been gleefully marshaled. What if human beings were wiped out tomorrow -- would all our current beliefs be true? What if we never inquired about a question -- such as how many cups of tea Chris Hookway drank on December 2, 1985? Would there be no truth of that matter?

Hookway is one of relatively few scholars of Peirce who understands that Peirce's account of truth is not an analysis of truth -- not a listing of necessary and sufficient conditions for when a belief is true (49). That is one important bulwark against the above misunderstandings. He is also one of the few scholars of Peirce who understands that when Peirce says that true beliefs are those on which there would be agreement at the end of inquiry, Peirce requires that the agreement be warranted by how things are, whatever that amounts to in this or that domain of inquiry. Hookway's essays illuminate this sophisticated kind of pragmatism and show how it is a compelling position.

For instance, "Pragmatism and the Given: C.I. Lewis, Quine and Peirce" is, in my view, one of the best papers written about the heady days when Quine was supposedly carving out a new and bold theory, but was really repeating what his teacher Lewis had said -- and what Lewis, much more honestly, rightly attributed to Peirce. Hookway busts the myth that Lewis was in the grip of the Myth of the Given, in which we are given something in experience that can ground our beliefs and provide them with the stamp of certainty. For Lewis, as for Peirce, the given is that which impinges upon us or resists our attempts to change it and thus constrains our opinions. It is not something with a particular structure or quality and it does not deliver certainty. Lewis, and Peirce before him, put forward a fallibilist view on which no kind of belief is immune from revision and in which all beliefs form an interconnected whole. Lewis and Peirce, that is, put forward a version of Quinean holism -- a version that I would argue is better since, especially in Lewis's hands, it makes ethics a part of that interconnected body of inquiry and knowledge.

Hookway goes on to identify the central worry for this fallibilist, yet objectivist version of pragmatism: how can we make sense of a non-conceptual but 'thin' given so that some interpretations of it are legitimate and others not? Lewis's answer starts with the idea that the given puts us in touch with the objects of knowledge, but it does not provide foundations or justifications for our beliefs. All of our beliefs are interpretations of the given. They are hence all fallible. But the given provides a brute reality check for us, as in Peirce's idealist who is "lounging down Regent St. . . . when some drunken fellow unexpectedly lets fly his fist and knocks him in the eye" (CP 5. 539). Hookway's attempt at resolving this deep problem in philosophy presents the best version of the tradition that moves from Peirce to Lewis to Quine to Sellars.

Another of Hookway's most significant contributions is to show that Peirce's argument is that when we assert a belief p, we commit ourselves to believing that experience will fall in line with p or with some successor of it. We expect that p, in some form, will survive the rigors of inquiry. We hope that p will prove indefeasible, but what will be undefeated is some refined version of our initial belief. In this way, an inquirer can assert something she thinks is probably not precisely true.

Indeed, perhaps the most useful lens through which Hookway focuses on pragmatism is that of Peirce's accounts of belief and assertion. Hookway expands upon his important work on these topics in the introduction. The founders of pragmatism adopt Alexander Bain's dispositional account of belief on which belief is a habit or a disposition to act. From this account of belief, the pragmatist theory of truth, Peirce claimed, is scarcely more than a corollary. In his later work, as Hookway shows us, Peirce worries that this account of belief runs the risk of making logic and truth be based on psychology. This is troubling to Peirce, as we could alter our nature, or our environment could alter it. That would make truth something that is malleable or plastic, which might have been fine by James's light. But Peirce disagrees with James on this core point. Logic is a normative science -- it is not based on what our cognitive goals happen to be, but on what they ought to be.

Hookway shows us that Peirce eventually replaces the notion of belief with that of judgment and assertion. He shows that Peirce's considered view is that when we make a judgment, we evaluate the various reasons and evidence for a belief. We subject our experiential judgments to rational scrutiny after they are prompted by what arrives brutely and uncritically. This does not altogether unhook truth and logic from human belief and psychology, but it makes sense of the notions of making a mistake, improving our beliefs, and aiming at something that goes beyond what we think here and now.

With respect to assertion, and along the same lines, Hookway shows that Peirce's view is that we take responsibility for what we assert. Peirce says: "Nobody takes any positive stock in those conventional utterances, such as 'I am perfectly delighted to see you,' upon whose falsehood no punishment at all is visited" (CP 5. 546). An assertion must be such that the speaker is held to account if what she says is false. Norms, standards, and aiming at truth are built into assertion. Hookway draws our attention here to an important passage in Peirce. The nature of an assertion is illustrated by a "very formal assertion such as an affidavit":

Here a man goes before a notary or magistrate and takes such action that if what he says is not true, evil consequences will be visited upon him, and this he does with a view to thus causing other men to be affected just as they would be if the proposition sworn to had presented itself to them as a perceptual fact. (CP 5.30)

Assertions have consequences and they are judged by whether those consequences pan out or not -- whether those consequences would lead to successful action or not. And successful action will vary depending on the kind of inquiry in question -- from engineering to ethics.

Finally (at least insofar as the confines of this review allow), Hookway has given us an illuminating interpretation of the Kantian impulse in Peirce and his successors -- Lewis and Sellars. Peirce invokes a naturalized version of Kant's transcendental point. He has no grandiose plans for this mode of argument: "I am not one of those transcendental apothecaries, as I call them -- they are so skilful in making up a bill -- who call for a quantity of big admissions, as indispensible Voraussetzungen of logic" (CP 2. 113). As Hookway tells us, Peirce thinks that to show that a belief is indispensible gives us no reason to believe that it is true, but it does provides a strong reason for hoping that it is true and for regarding it as legitimate in our search for knowledge (37).

The Peircean pragmatist position that Hookway presents is a far cry from what is generally taken to be pragmatism: the Jamesian, Rortyian position which, in its loosest manifestations, has it that truth is what is best for me or you to believe (James at his worst) or that truth is what our peers will let us get away with saying (Rorty at his worst). In one paper in this excellent volume -- "Fallibilism and the Aim of Inquiry" -- Hookway very successfully disposes of Rorty's claim that truth is not our aim in inquiry. Here, and elsewhere, Hookway is one of the primary architects of the better, Peircean, pragmatist view.