The Pragmatic Turn in Philosophy: Contemporary Engagements between Analytic and Continental Thought

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William Egginton and Mike Sandbothe (eds.), The Pragmatic Turn in Philosophy: Contemporary Engagements between Analytic and Continental Thought, SUNY Press, 2004, 262pp., $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780791460702.

Reviewed by Stephan Käufer, Franklin & Marshall College



Most of the essays in this volume were previously collected in Sandbothe’s Die Renaissance des Pragmatismus (Weilerwist: Velbrück Wissenschaft, 2001). They have now been translated or reprinted, and in some cases modified by the authors in response to just the kind of exchange that motivated the original volume and that the present volume hopes to continue. According to the editors’ introduction a lot is at stake in a current renewed emphasis on pragmatism. It builds bridges between analytic and continental philosophy, as well as between philosophy and literary theory. It also develops arguments against representationalist epistemology and in doing so searches for a common idiom that can serve an “ecumenical”, “transcontinental” and trans-disciplinary “philosophy of the next century”. The ecumenical potential of neo-pragmatism is overstated, as this volume itself makes clear. Some basic claims of this new pragmatism may interest university deans and disturb graduate students who, it seems, must make a choice whether they should read Hegel and Heidegger or master symbolic logic. That one might be interested in doing both is unthinkable, even for these new, ecumenical writers. For in the end they admit that, despite all the talk of bridge-building, the split between “Continental” and “analytic” philosophy is unlikely to be healed. What emerges, though, is an interesting and nuanced debate about the internal tensions and future direction of the pragmatist critique of representationalism.

The unifying vision in the background is Richard Rorty’s, and it is his thought and its current appeal among philosophers in Germany that forms the backbone of this collection. Except for the contributions by Hilary Putnam, Arthur Fine and Antje Gimmler, all other essays in this volume are more or less sympathetic commentaries on Rorty’s ideas. Rorty’s own paper rehearses his familiar criticisms of analytic philosophy and outlines his hopes for a day when it will be abandoned. That day will not be brought about by a new argument within the research programs established by analytic philosophy; no amount of careful and detailed reflection on the status of claims to scientific realism, say, can produce the “great imaginative feats” required for philosophical progress. Instead philosophers are “waiting for a guru”, which, Rorty insists, is a “perfectly respectable thing to do”. However, that is not all they are doing. We can already find hints of the guru in the work of Arthur Fine, Robert Brandom, and Donald Davidson. They agree that “we should be neither realists nor antirealists” and for Rorty this consensus marks “a breakthrough into a new philosophical world”. Of course the philosophical world for Fine, Brandom, and Davidson does not consist of the purely negative rejection of traditional debates about realism. Rather, each in his own way, these philosophers show us how we may conceive of our normative commitments to a world of existing objects without falling into the Cartesian mode of describing our relation to this world. The norms for the correctness of our claims, including existential claims, in science as much as in theology, derive from the material commitments inherent in our linguistic practices, or in the holistic fit of our web of beliefs. Or, as Arthur Fine argues in his APA Presidential address, reprinted in this volume, we can find these norms in the objectivity implicit in our procedures for dealing with the products of inquiry. In each case we do without the problems of Cartesian epistemology, so we can shed the preoccupation with those philosophical nouns that Rorty likes to capitalize in order to decry their quasi-mystical status: Truth, the World, the Real, the Way Things Really Are, etc.

Rorty often attempts to use his pragmatist critique of analytic philosophy to suggest what appears to be a simple change of topic. Instead of truth or realism, philosophers should care more about political liberalism or agonized consciences. This volume shows that few fellow neo-pragmatists are willing to give up criticizing the old topics. Barry Allen shows why that may be so. Hope, he points out, is neither the opposite of, nor a substitute for knowledge; on the contrary, it needs the support of knowledge. Rorty’s suggestion to abandon the latter and turn to the former rests, Allen suggests, on his overly aggressive deflationism about the topics of traditional epistemology. Allen may be reading too much into a rhetorical exaggeration, as Ludwig Nagl points out. Nagl explains the move from reason to hope in Rorty and James. Through its emphasis on the “primacy of the practical” pragmatism moves the future-directed dimension of human experience into the philosophical spotlight. The point is not that we ought to stop talking about reason and what we can know, and instead talk about hope and what we should do. Rather, pragmatism aims to show that reason and knowledge are based in practical comportment and hence inherently and irreducibly future-directed; properly understood they are close cousins to hope. We thus, to put it bluntly, cannot pursue knowledge without some conception of utopia in the background. The primacy of the practical is arguably the deepest link between American pragmatism and Heidegger’s hermeneutic phenomenology, so Nagl’s essay opens up the prospect of a bridge to the continent. It is one of only three essays in this volume to do so effectively.

The tenor of Allen’s claim, that neo-pragmatism must do more to justify its deflationist attitudes if it is to earn the right to turn traditional Anglophone philosophy on its head, is developed more subtly in the essays by Albrecht Wellmer, Wolfgang Welsch, Joseph Margolis, and Hilary Putnam. They drag truth, norms, representations, and realism back onto the neo-pragmatist stage and thus highlight how difficult it is to accept even the most central claims of Rortyan pragmatism.

Wellmer, in the tradition of German transcendental pragmatists such as Jurgen Habermas and Karl-Otto Apel, points out that even without a capital letter, truth constitutes a focal point of philosophical analysis. Pragmatists aim to turn questions about the truth of a claim into questions about justification of the claim, or, in Sellars’ and Brandom’s phrase, into questions about the social space of reasons. In doing so they endorse a deflationary theory of truth. An asserted content is true precisely when that content is asserted and hence taken up into the practice of giving and asking for reasons. Against this position Wellmer argues that the very idea of norms for justifications implicitly refers to “context-transcending and transsubjective truth claims”. Appealing to Wittgenstein, Wellmer points out that some claims must stand fast for a community of inquirers to be able to question, doubt, or justify. Such standing fast is normative, but not in the same way as norms that govern justifications within the framework. Some infallible, context-independent truth norm functions as the condition of the possibility of the space of reasons, and hence must be presumed by a consistent pragmatism. Deflationism presumes this norm, but cannot articulate it. In this argument Wellmer may underestimate the flexibility of Rorty’s Davidsonian piecemeal fallibilism; while all our beliefs are susceptible to the constant reweaving of the web of beliefs, we cannot change them all at once. As Wittgenstein argued, there is nothing about a belief itself that determines that it stands fast; what beliefs happen to stand fast for a culture tells us a lot about the culture, not the beliefs. Nevertheless Wellmer’s paper shows that the problems pragmatism tries to leave behind with its rejection of correspondence theories of truth can be reproduced within the pragmatic position. While Rorty and Brandom identify with Hegel’s reversal of Kant’s objective commitments, Wellmer, we might say, reintroduces the Kantian viewpoint into the pragmatist landscape.

Wolfgang Welsch analyzes the structure and status of arguments in Rorty’s writing. Interestingly his conclusion deeply parallels Wellmer’s. Rorty’s new pragmatism presents itself as a “kind of writing” in which rhetorical persuasion takes the place of argument, but the force of Rorty’s anti-philosophical rhetoric implies the very standards that make traditional arguments possible. Welsch distinguishes a foundationalist conception of argument, presumed by Rorty’s “antiargumentative” style, from a looser conception of arguments as Lyotard-style language games. According to the foundationalist conception arguments can only take place on the basis of a shared vocabulary, methods, standards for evidence, etc. Since Rorty wants us to abandon the basic vocabulary of representationalist philosophy, he takes it that there is no point in trying to argue for this shift, for any such argument would be committed to the very foundation it aims to reject. Instead we should simply come up with new descriptions without presuming that our newly imagined vocabularies are in any way better, or final. Welsch points out that this conversational model endorsed by Rorty has its own dialectic structure, which enables “interconceptual argument”. The pragmatists’ new descriptions may not share the basic assumptions of representationalist views, but the two outlooks surely share some elements, such as a commitment to consistency and coherence, some logical structures, and a few common content areas. The conversational philosophy envisioned by Rorty is not a mere conversation; it continues to employ reason and its rhetorical moves appeal to the standard philosophical predilection for finding out truth by force of the better argument.

Much of the revival of pragmatism focuses on debates about the rejection of realism. In developing his notion of internal realism, Putnam sharply criticizes Rorty for insisting that we ought to let go of the very idea that science is getting the world “right”. This, Putnam claims, leads inevitably to relativism and he opposes it with his notion of a limit-concept of truth that regulates all inquiry. Rorty rejoins that in doing so Putnam slips back into a scientific positivism that his pragmatic approach aims to avoid. Joseph Margolis argues that this standoff is the result of a lingering Cartesianism in the language of modern anglophone philosophy. Rorty and Putnam are unable to get beyond the extreme positions of positivism and relativism because they continue to put the point using Cartesian notions of subject and object. In particular, both Rorty and Putnam (and Davidson) bind themselves to a false dichotomy: either the intermediaries (or “tertia”) between consciousness and reality are relational, or there are no such things at all. This ignores a third option derived from Hegel’s critical appropriation of Kant’s empirical realism. There are conceptual intermediaries, but they do not relate to reality; rather they construct it by inflecting our historically situated consciousness. Margolis does not elaborate on the details of this proposal here. His suggestion draws attention to the status of the idiom adopted by neo-pragmatism: if we are to escape the presuppositions of representationalism, we must eschew its language as well. This requires that we pay more careful attention to Hegel.

Putnam’s contribution to this volume does not deal directly with his internal realism, but nevertheless participates in the fruitful exchange between the papers by Rorty, Margolis, Wellmer, and Welsch. He focuses on the notion of truth in moral claims and develops William James’ view that such truths come into the world when there are two or more people, and hence are subject to norms developed communally. Wellmer, of course, questions the possibility of a communal truth norm. Putnam’s pragmatist response is that one can be committed to truth-talk in ethics on the basis of ethical consensus without thereby having to endorse a metaphysical theory of truth as consensus. Not even the limit-concept, it seems, is needed for us rationally to discuss moral assertions as true or false.

Mike Sandbothe and Antje Gimmler turn to the historical dimension of neo-pragmatism, beyond its obvious root in American pragmatism. Sandbothe traces elements of neo-pragmatic holisms and anti-representationalism to various moments of the “linguistic turn” from Russell to Davidson, guided by Rorty’s own analysis of the history of language-oriented philosophy. Not surprisingly Wittgenstein, Quine, Sellars, and Davidson turn out to be the heroes of this familiar story, which Sandbothe here presents for readers who come to the neo-pragmatism from non-philosophical disciplines. Gimmler analyzes the primacy of practice as it figures in Hegel’s analysis of self-consciousness. She shows convincingly that there is more pragmatism in Hegel than those neo-pragmatists who claim his mantle, Rorty and Brandom, derive from his writings. Rorty limits his exegesis of Hegel to the broadly historicist claims. Brandom looks more closely at Hegel’s insistence on the essential externality of concepts and uses it to ground his view that conceptual content is exhausted by the commitments and entitlements implicit in shared concept-use. Gimmler argues, however, that for Hegel thinking is not merely tied up with practical activity; it is itself an activity. The full meaning of Hegel’s rejection of representationalism is not grasped until one sees that thinking is acting and hence constitutively impacts its environment. This shows itself most clearly in Hegel’s analysis of self-consciousness in the master-slave dialectic. The slave’s work is not merely a precondition for conceptual thought and self-consciousness; work is the self-conscious transformation of the environment and this, for Hegel, is already all there is to thought.

It is precisely at this point that we can best appreciate the fruitful suggestion in William Egginton’s essay. Egginton shows himself to be the most faithful practitioner of the new pragmatism and the only author in this volume to take the editorial promissory notes seriously. He makes connections to literary theory, moving fluidly from Rorty to Lacan, from Dennett to Zizek; he embraces the fundamental tenets of Rortyan pragmatism without further agonizing about transcendental truth norms or Cartesian representations. Further, he practices the Rortyan idiom. While the other pragmatists in this volume write conventional, academic prose, Egginton’s writing approaches Rorty’s colloquial voice, his informal and seemingly effortless redescriptions, and his continual connection of the philosophical position to personal outlook (“we pragmatist” in Rorty, and “pragmatists like me” in Egginton). Egginton argues that Lacan’s explanation of desire in terms of jouissance can serve to overcome Rorty’s “dogmatic refusal” to countenance substantial and irreducible first-person experiences that are ineffable and hence, for nominalists like Rorty, off the philosophical chart. Egginton aims to redescribe the ineffable by precisely ignoring its failure to achieve linguistic status and instead conceives of it, with Lacan, as bodily sensations, flushes, and affects. But we do not need to invoke Lacan to make this point. As Gimmler shows, a focus on the active, working body as the locus of thought is the central element of Hegel’s anti-representationalism. Read in conjunction with Gimmler, Egginton’s essay thus serves to underscore Margolis’ claim that the new pragmatists still have not learned to put their points in a vocabulary that truly leaves subject-object language behind. To avoid the problems raised by Wellmer, Putnam, and Margolis, the new pragmatists need to talk about embodied thought.