The Primacy of Grammar

Placeholder book cover

Nirmalangshu Mukherji, The Primacy of Grammar, MIT Press, 2010, 278pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262014052.

Reviewed by Wolfram Hinzen, David Kirkby, and Ulrich Reichard, University of Durham


The Primacy of Grammar (PG) is a wide ranging book which dips in and out of material as disparate as logical theory, the philosophy of science, and musical cognition. Despite this variety -- or maybe because of it -- the book is highly readable and relevant to several different subject areas. The core idea that animates the book and gives it focus is that grammar occupies an especially prominent position in our understanding of language and, possibly, the mind. The book is thereby strikingly comparable to Tom Roeper's recent book The Prism of Grammar (Roeper, 2007), which equally looks at the mind through grammatical lenses and concludes that grammatical theory comes with insights that carry us far beyond its proper territory (see also Hinzen, 2006).

While Roeper's book is a linguists' work, engaging hands-on with minute details of child language, Mukherji's stance is that of a philosopher wanting to tease out what makes grammar special in the landscape of the human sciences and science as such. The point of departure is the biolinguistic program inaugurated by Noam Chomsky in the 1950s, which extracts language out of the socio-cultural complexities of human agency that language unfailingly involves, with the aim of turning it into a subject matter of science. As Mukherji notes, the idea of a science of language is one of the most ancient human endeavours, going back to Classical India more than two millennia ago (22).

In particular, the latest phase of the biolinguistic enterprise, the Minimalist Program, has, in Mukherji's words, 'raised the prospects' (xv) for having identified a 'new aspect' of the natural world (27), employing a 'Galilean style' of inquiry otherwise familiar only from physics. Yet the generative enterprise has proceeded in essential 'isolation' from the rest of the sciences (24). Mukherji's thoughts here are sobering: awaiting integration with biology and physics despite a massive body of theory and explanatory depth achieved, the integration of biolinguistics with the rest of science is likely to depend on solving unification problems far deeper than we have encountered in even more fundamental sciences (23-5).

What is the basis of this predicament? Biolinguistics has isolated as its primary object of inquiry the computational system of human language (CHL) -- a procedure computing over symbolic mental representations used to express thoughts and emotions. Theoretical descriptions of this system in recent years have become highly abstract, minimal, and austere, making its design principles seem more like those we expect in physics. This is part of what raises prospects for having found a real 'joint of nature' (ch. 7), which, because of its abstractness and general computational properties, may illuminate other cognitive domains such as music or arithmetic as well, insofar as these involve similar formal complexities. These domains fall into what Mukherji calls the 'hominid set'. A 'musilanguage hypothesis' defending this claim for the case of music is developed in chapter 6.

Chapter 1 is partially negative. Its aim is to defend, against frequent philosophical objections, the position that grammar is as real an object as any postulate of a truly scientific theory can be and that grammatical theory is driven, as are other sciences, by problems and puzzles that emerge internally to it. Chapter 2 gives a flavour of classical Government & Binding (G&B) style linguistic theory, in a pedagogically very clear and helpful manner. Chapters 3 and 4 develop a more sceptical claim central to the first part of the book, according to which understanding of language at the desired level is essentially restricted to what we know about grammar, leaving out much of what fills textbooks in the philosophy of language and linguistics, including theories of truth conditions, concepts, and communication. Chapter 5 continues the introduction to linguistic theory from Chapter 2 with a focus on Minimalism.

In his characterization of the scope of grammatical theory, Mukherji stresses, as Hinzen (2006) does, how grammatical theory is fundamentally concerned with interpretive matters, such as quantifier scope, anaphoric relations, etc. In other words, semantic information falls out from grammatical operations, and, as such, the output of the grammar is properly thought of as a logical form (LF). Mukherji's strategy is to discuss semantic concepts that have been added to those of narrow syntax (the Lexicon-to-LF computation) and to ask what explanatory value they add, reaching a negative conclusion overall. Indeed, where an 'inferential conception of semantics' is rejected (following Fodor), and an externalist conception is empirically refuted (following Chomsky), it is not clear what of semantic theory remains. LF as such clearly falls short of the "full-blooded concept of meaning" (157) philosophers tend to be interested in.

In Chapter 3 (the most philosophical part of the book), truth theories are specifically criticised for failing to capture the informal intuitions they purport to characterize (a seminal case will be discussed further below) or for simply duplicating work already done by a grammatical analysis. For example, while the ambiguity of 'every boy dances with a girl' can be described in terms of two different formal representations in a truth-conditional semantics, the ambiguity is already explained grammatically in terms of movement of quantifiers and their relative scope, which are triggered on grammar-internal grounds (cf. 67-70):

[IP [every boy]i [ei danced with a girl]]

[IP [a girl]j [IP [every boy]i [ei danced with ej]]]

The conclusion is drawn that formal semantics, insofar as it captures a broader and non-grammatical notion of meaning, is not empirically significant. Nor, according to Mukherji, is there a theory of 'concepts' that is capable of achieving this either. Despite the work done in lexical semantics, in Chapter 4 it is argued that in the absence of more stable patterns of usage, Quinean scepticism about the determinacy of a term's meaning is warranted.

In the rest of the review we will discuss Mukherji's claims on the interface between grammar and interpretation more closely (Section II). We then discuss his arguments for the prospects that CHL might turn out as a general and distinguishing feature of the human mind (Section III).


Mukherji's central point about the absence of a divide between grammar and interpretation is a valuable one and serves to emphasise the chasm between the conception of grammar being discussed and a logical syntax of some formal language whose purpose is solely to determine whether an expression is a well-formed formula of a language or not. Mukherji also correctly highlights how there is no principled way of disentangling grammatical effects from pragmatic ones (26) -- e.g., the grammatical difference between actives and passives has clear discourse effects that seem pragmatic in nature.

This idea works in tandem with Mukherji's criticism of truth conditional theories of meaning. At the end of the third chapter Mukherji argues persuasively that semanticists have been mistaken in analysing the phrase the F is G in terms of Russell's 'Uniqueness condition': that there is exactly one F that is G. While this quantificational analysis is easily represented in truth conditional notation, it doesn't capture the resource-presenting function of determiners. Thus, whereas 'The man shot them' updates information for an already given discourse referent (definiteness), the purportedly equivalent 'exactly one man shot them' fails to do that. The latter expression rather introduces a new referent. Mukherji complains that truth conditional semantic frameworks are incapable of capturing this fact about definite descriptions. In contrast, definiteness can be understood in terms of the feature specification of lexical items and their role in grammatical computation (84).

Consequently, and in keeping with the overarching theme of the book, the potential scope of biolinguistics is much greater than supposed in the G&B era. Semantic phenomena formerly captured by separate theories appended to grammatical theory fall within the purview of biolinguistics. Indeed, it isn't clear why Mukherji attempts to preserve a special LF or "minimum semantics" (174) at all. The resources needed to identify minimum semantics do not seem to be available. Within the Minimalist framework, the vast majority of grammatical operations are understood in terms of general efficiency principles or the satisfaction of interface conditions imposed by external systems, which include the conceptual-intentional systems (C-I). Mukherji argues that the class of minimum semantics is determined by effects of a special subset of C-I systems. This subset is taken to be those systems that are specifically linguistic: the faculty of language-driven interpretive systems (FLI systems), which occupy a privileged "special location" at the edge of CHL (176). He contends that the semantic procedures dealt with by FLI systems are "radically different" from those that are not. Their scope is rightly left as an empirical issue (176).

Given this, Mukherji's dismissal of truth and reference as failing "to be psychological categories at all" (106) may be premature. Throughout the book, frustration with theories of meaning that take these externalist denotational categories as theoretical primitives is palpable. However, it is not impossible, and there is some evidence, that human grammar is precisely organized around forms of reference and deixis that are humanly specific. If so, reference and truth quite rightly have the central place that philosophers have long taken them to have: they are arguably just as specific to language as, say, anaphoric binding is. Rather than simply eradicating them, we should aim to incorporate them within an explanatory theory of language. Recent work on phases as units of semantic interpretation organizing the referential ontology of meaning may be conducive to this aim. The internal operations of language may be orientated towards the historically externalist notions of truth and reference after all (though for a contrary view see Pietroski, 2005). If grammar, semantics and pragmatics are as indistinguishable as Mukherji indicates, this result may not actually be very surprising.


As noted, Mukherji argues extensively for the scientific character of biolinguistics, which he takes to have 'identified a new aspect of the world' (28). Only his argument in the last chapter shows the full theoretical potential of this claim. Here Mukherji argues that the principles of CHL are not restricted to language but define a human specific class of unbounded symbolic systems.

For the last century, the philosophy of mind was primarily concerned with questions about the relation between mental phenomena and physical phenomena or behaviour. Therefore, the discussion centred on fundamental oppositions such as dualism vs. some form of materialism or -- in respect of the primary source of evidence for questions about the mind -- introspection vs. mind-independent observations. Mukherji's approach to ask for the nature and extension of CHL puts these issues aside and offers a very different but promising way to approach the human mind with the help of an empirical theory.

Mukherji's argument begins with the current Minimalist tendency to formulate linguistic principles in terms which are not linguistically specific. Many principles such as principles of least effort are seen as conditions of nature which language thus shares not only with other cognitive domains, but a much broader spectrum of natural phenomena, including insect navigation, the trajectory of the planets, and the form of snowflakes. Apart from the lexicon, only the basic combinatorial operation Merge, which guarantees the recursive way in which lexical items are put together so as to yield complex linguistic expressions, is taken to be language specific.

In order to pursue his claim that CHL is a general but species specific feature of human cognition, Mukherji has to show, firstly, that Merge is not restricted to language but also applies to other domains and, secondly, that there is no clear sense according to which the same principles of least effort can be seen as applying to language, insect navigation, and the shape of snowflakes. Mukherji's latter claim is motivated by a distinction between the general form of explanation and the actual explanation of a specific phenomenon. For example, in linguistics the principles of least effort are formulated in terms of computational efficiency. However, even though it is possible to describe snowflakes and the trajectory of a comet in computational terms, it does not make sense to think of them as solving equations. 'We need to distinguish, then, between symbol-processing systems per se and our ability to describe some system with symbols' (238). Mukherji concludes his argument by identifying the ability to compute with the possession of CHL.

In support of the first claim above, Mukherji argues, following a remark of Wittgenstein's, that music is meaningful in the very same way in which language is. As noted above, Mukherji takes the only way in which the meaning of linguistic expressions is accessible to empirical investigation to consist in the structural differences between different types of expressions. Therefore, meaning in language is something internal to language. Mukherji also refutes the hypothesis that music is (solely) the expression of emotions. He argues that, just as in language, in any particular piece of music there are internal structural relations which govern our understanding of it. This notion of internal significance, he reasons, 'could well be a general phenomenon for the natural symbol systems, the hominid set, at issue' (209).

Furthermore, drawing on data from both Western and Indian classical music, he maintains that there is no test for recursion which language passes but music does not pass. Therefore, music should be taken to be recursive in the very way language is. As Merge is defined as the simplest recursive operation and as there is no evidence that the recursive structure of music is more complex than that of language, Merge (pace Hauser et al., 2002 and Lehrdahl and Jackendoff, 2006) should be taken to apply to both music and language. The differences between music, language, logic and arithmetic thus do not consist in the general mechanism of computation; rather they are restricted to different kinds of lexical items in the respective domains as well as the domain specificity of the interface conditions.

Overall, Mukherji urges that the computational system of human language is not language specific but restricted to a small number of human domains and thus defines the 'hominid set'. If this thesis turns out to be correct, the part of reality which the study of CHL reveals comes close to what one might expect from an empirical investigation of the mind. Although it will not cover every aspect of the mind which philosophers have been interested in, it makes sense to regard it as a core topic in a future philosophy of mind based on grammar. We might note that this, at the same time, would be a very old philosophy of mind, since it has many affinities with the stance taken by Universal grammarians in regards to the primacy of grammar in Ancient India. However austere and bleak Mukherji's picture may seem at times, it is a bold and impressive attempt to reorganize the landscape of the philosophy of mind and language.


Hauser, M. D., Chomsky, N. and Fitch, W. T., 2002: 'The Faculty of Language: What is it, Who has it, and How did it Evolve?' Science, 298, pp. 1569-79.

Hinzen, W. 2006: Mind design and minimal syntax, Oxford University Press.

Lerdahl, F. and Jackendoff, R., 2006: 'The capacity for music: What is it, and what's special about it?' Cognition, 100, pp. 33-72.

Pietroski, P. M., 2005: 'Meaning before truth', Contextualism in Philosophy: Knowledge, Meaning, and Truth, Preyer, G. and Peter, G. (eds.), Oxford University Press, pp. 255-302.

Roeper, T. 2007: The Prism of Grammar, MIT Press.