The Primacy of the Subjective: Foundations for a Unified Theory of Mind and Language

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Nicholas Georgalis, The Primacy of the Subjective: Foundations for a Unified Theory of Mind and Language, MIT Press, 2006, 336pp, $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262072653.

Reviewed by Steven Horst, Wesleyan University


In this book, Nicholas Georgalis argues for a number of claims that run against the grain of most contemporary discussions of intentionality. Some of these are critical claims, in that they attempt to refute contemporary orthodoxies concerning broad content and (lack of) privileged access. We might enumerate them as follows:

1) There is a component of content, called "minimal content", that is underdetermined by all third-person facts; it is fixed by, and identifiable only from, a first-person perspective. Hence a study of content requires first-person as well as third-person methodologies.

2) A person has privileged access to this minimal content, in the limited sense of having a non-inferential access that is different from the inferential access we have to the mental states of others.

3) Minimal content is equivalent neither to broad content nor to the sort of "narrow" content defined in terms of third-person functional properties.

4) Minimal content lies at the core of "the fundamental intentional state": without minimal content, there is no intentional content at all.

5) The type of first-person relation to minimal content is not what some philosophers (e.g., Horgan and Tienson 2002) have called "phenomenal intentionality" or "the phenomenality of intentionality".

The critical theses are all about the proper analysis of intentionality. (9) In addition to this, Georgalis is concerned with issues in the metaphysics of mind, particularly to argue (Chapter 4) that the irreducibility (indeed, underdetermination) of minimal content by third-person facts does not entail dualism, and is compatible with materialism. This involves several more speculative theses:

6) The irreducibility of the subjective does not entail dualism.

7) The irreducibility of the subjective is compatible with materialism.

8) The appearance of an entailment of dualism and incompatibility with materialism is a consequence of certain outdated assumptions from classical physics.

9) There are features of contemporary physics -- particularly chaos theory -- that provide a way of seeing how the irreducibility of first-person facts can be consistent with materialism.

This is an important, perhaps even an agenda-changing, book -- one that deserves the attention of any philosopher concerned with issues of content, intentionality, consciousness and the metaphysics of mind. I find the critical theses 1-4 persuasively argued, though in my opinion Georgalis overestimates the differences between his position and those of some advocates of phenomenal intentionality. The strength of the speculative claims turns upon the discussion of the implications of chaos theory. In my opinion, what Georgalis has presented here is at best a compatibility proof for irreducibility with physicalism, and lacks the detailed development of an account of mind and matter that would make the view more concrete and persuasive. This is, however, charitably regarded as putting a new view on the table for further discussion, much like Chalmers' (1996) discussions of panprotopsychism or Searle's repeated (but never filled-out) appeals to "the causal powers of the brain". It is my guess that it is the critical theses that will garner the most attention (and criticism) from philosophers invested in reductive or third-person methodologies, and that it is these that will potentially make this book a locus classicus for the next stage of debate about theories of content, intentionality and consciousness.

The Case for Minimal Content

The core of this book is the articulation of a case for a notion of "minimal content" that requires a central role for first-person approaches to the mind. This view is initially laid out in Chapter 1, and defended more extensively in Chapters 2 and 6-8. Georgalis right-headedly avoids the trap of assuming that there is a forced choice between broad and narrow notions of content, and holds that both are required for a full analysis of intentional states. (53) There is indeed, as Kripke (1972) and Putnam (1975) have argued, a component of content that is underdetermined either by what is "in the head" or what is available from a first-person perspective. Georgalis agrees that no amount of introspection, conceptual analysis or thought experiment will reveal that 'water' picks out H2O rather than XYZ. Yet there is also an aspect of content that is underdetermined by third-person physical, neural, causal and functional facts, and this "minimal content" is necessary for any sort of content or intentionality to get off the ground. Without minimal content, we have only what Searle calls "as-if" intentionality of the sort displayed by computers and thermometers.

An important intuition-pump Georgalis offers works like this. Suppose someone sets out to draw a picture of Grandma. The resulting picture looks very little like Grandma. It might, in fact, look much more like something else: Uncle Phil or even a tree. But the question of who or what it is a picture of is settled, not by what the picture most resembles, but by the person's intentions in drawing the picture. Similarly, if one is asked to think about Grandma, such mental imagery as one entertains in so doing is about Grandma (in an appropriately narrow sense of 'about') simply because that was one's intention, regardless of whether the mental imagery does not look much like Grandma herself, or even if, say, one is in fact adopted, and the person one has taken to be one's grandmother in fact is not. This minimal content of the thought is not to be construed broadly, as determining the extension of the thought, but rather as the content as understood by the subject. (5-8) As a result, an agent has a limited sort of privileged access to minimal content, in that she can determine it non-inferentially. Moreover, the fact that the thought has that minimal content is partly constitutive of its identity as that thought. It could not have been the selfsame thought with a different minimal content.

The example of imagining one's grandmother strikes me as decisive against resemblance accounts of intentional content. However, they are not proof against causal and functional theories. More effective against these is a second set of examples, involving various mathematicians working with formalized symbol systems. (14-19) Any system of symbol-manipulations admits of multiple interpretations: e.g., in mathematical or set-theoretic terms. Two mathematicians might perform exactly the same symbol-manipulations in accordance with the axioms, one thinking about numbers and the other about sets. Or indeed, a single mathematician might do the same operation multiple times, sometimes thinking about numbers and sometimes thinking about sets. This shows that the functional description of the symbol-manipulations underdetermines the content of the mathematician's intentional states. And in the case of numbers and sets, there can be no possibility of the referents (numbers or sets) being the causes of the content-tokenings, as they are abstract objects and do not enter into causal relations. (28) Which sorts of objects the mathematician is thinking of at a given time is something that (a) can be determined decisively only from her own first-person perspective, and (b) is fixed by first-person facts rather than third-person functional or causal relations. Moreover, as Searle has argued over the years, a digital computer can perform analogous symbol manipulations, and when the computer does so, the symbols do not mean anything at all to the computer. Georgalis claims that it is this selfsame minimal content, which is intrinsically tied to the first-person perspective, that makes for the difference between meaningful thoughts in humans and meaningless symbol-manipulations in computers (27-28), so that minimal content is fundamental, in the sense of being a necessary condition for having any sort of genuine intentionality at all. (22)

The view Georgalis defends is that a specification of the content of an intentional state requires two elements:

Minimal content represents the subject of an intentional state as the subject conceives it.

Objective content represents the subject an objective observer would ascribe as the subject of the agent's intentional state. (7)

Georgalis goes on to formalize these notions in the following way:

The schema for an intentional state is Ψ(R) where Ψ is some psychological mode (e.g., believing or desiring) and R is the representational (or intentional) content and is distinct from the intentional object, as defined by Searle. If I am right, any such schema also requires a twofold decomposition:




where m is the minimal content, o is the objective content, and phi is what is attributed to "the subject of one's thought". (8)

So if Jones believes "water is delicious", the psychological attitude Ψ is one of belief, the minimal content m is the kind of understanding Jones has of water (say, "clear liquid found in lakes and streams"), the objective content is (perhaps among other things) water's true nature as H2O, and Φ is the property of being delicious.

This involves several claims of varying degrees of plausibility. Most fundamentally, it seems right that a thorough characterization of Jones's intentional state requires (at least) two elements: one which picks out its intentional object in "objective" terms, and another that picks it out as understood by Jones. As Fodor argued (e.g., Fodor 1981), we need the latter to account for the inferences Jones is inclined to make from his belief, which might differ depending on such things as whether he knows that water is H2O. I am unclear why Georgalis makes this distinction with respect to the subject of an intentional state but not to the predicate -- i.e., why the same Φ is attributed to both the minimal and the objective content. (Cf. 9.) For example, if the belief is "the stuff in the glass is water", 'water' occupies the predicate slot of the belief, and presumably the same distinction between the way the agent understands 'water' and the way an observer would understand it might differ in precisely the same way that they do when 'water' occupies the "subject" slot.

What will probably prove most controversial to readers is Georgalis's take on the relation between the minimal and objective content: to wit, that minimal content is fundamental, both in that it alone gives the content a requisite degree of determinacy (think of the numbers/sets case) and that it is a prerequisite for by-golly content being in the picture at all. I share Georgalis's intuitions here: that it is, in part, because Jones's mental state involves a non-broad element picking out "that clear liquid …" that it picks out water, and that without such a component, it would have no meaning at all, and be a case of "intentionality" only in an analogous or derivative sense. (See Horst 1996 and Searle 1992 for similar views.) But given that so many philosophers have thus far resisted this position, I am not sure that Georgalis has given it the kind of decisive argumentation he has given for the role of minimal content in fixing the determinacy of content in the numbers/sets cases.

What Georgalis has attempted to do here is to carve out an area of content -- minimal content -- that is closely tied to the first-person perspective, and which brings with it a privileged access for the agent. He repeatedly rejects the stronger, and untenable, views that minimal content exhausts the content of a mental state, or that an agent has privileged or incorrigible access to broad or objective content.

Relation to Kindred Views

In some ways, while Georgalis has presented new and engaging arguments for his claims, some of the main elements of his critical theses are not new. On the one hand, they might be seen as an attempt to revive a role for familiar notions of "narrow" content. And if "narrow" content is any content that is not "broad", this might be correct. However, "narrow" content is often cashed out in functional terms that are incompatible with Georgalis's characterization of minimal content. As the numbers/sets case is meant to show, functional or inferential role underdetermines what a person means. Functional or inferential role, moreover, are notions accessible from a third-person perspective, while Georgalis claims that minimal content is accessible only from a first-person perspective.

Georgalis is also at pains to differentiate his view from those of some advocates of "phenomenal intentionality" and "the phenomenality of intentionality." While these phrases are derived from Horgan and Tienson (2002), Georgalis's discussion of this topic (67-76) discusses neither that article, nor kindred claims in other writers like Siewert (1998) and Horst (1996), choosing instead to concentrate on a statement by Nagel (1974) to the effect that conscious states must have a "what it's like" quality, which Georgalis identifies with the kind of subjective feel of qualia. Georgalis thus seems to interpret advocates of phenomenal intentionality as understanding notions like "phenomenality" in a thin, Nagelian sense, modeled upon the phenomenological properties, or "subjective feels" of qualia, particularly sensory states. Minimal contents, on his view, are not individuated by distinctive "subjective feels", though they are individuated by things accessible only from the first-person perspective. This seems correct, and interpreting notions like "phenomenology" and "phenomenality" as restricted to qualitative "feels" has led some critics of phenomenal intentionality to find the view implausible. However, it is not clear that any of its advocates really understood such notions in this thin, Nagelian way. Indeed, some (Horst 1996) were working out of a Husserlian notion of "phenomenology" in which the scope of "the phenomenological" is not confined to, or even principally concerned with, qualia, but rather contains everything left over after the phenomenological bracketings -- something which decisively includes intentional states. Georgalis's own view seems in line with this, and in this reader's opinion, he has unnecessarily distanced himself from his closest allies here.

The Turn to Chaos Theory

Georgalis's discussion of the metaphysics of intentionality falls more in the speculative vein. Some proponents of the irreducibility of qualia, such as Chalmers (1996) and Robinson (2004) have taken this irreducibility to imply some form of dualism. Proponents of such views, however, have often assumed that intentionality can be cashed out in functionalist terms, so that, for example, a zombie that was physically or functionally identical to a human being and embedded in the same history and environment would necessarily have the same intentional states as that human being. (With the exception of reference to different particulars in their respective environments, where broad content tracks individuals rather than kinds.) But if conscious phenomenology plays a crucial role in intentionality as well, this would seem to imply that the very arguments for a dualism that places qualia outside the physical realm would need to do so for intentionality, or at least for minimal content, as well.

Georgalis wishes to resist this conclusion, and maintain a form of physicalism. Irreducible mental properties are not, after all, logically incompatible with all forms of physicalism, but chiefly with reductive physicalism. Reductive physicalism, in turn, was developed in early modernity in tandem with classical mechanics. Classical physics, however, has been superseded by more adequate views, and these (particularly chaos theory) cut against reductionism.

On this general point, Georgalis and I agree, and I applaud him for pointing out what so many philosophers of mind have somehow managed to ignore. His emphasis, however, is different from the one that I have advocated. He locates the problem in classical physics, and the solution in contemporary developments in physics, particularly chaos theory. The latter, he points out, militates against reductionism. In a weak form, it does so because any finite approximation of a system will be too coarse-grained to capture facts that are salient to the evolving dynamics of the system. On a stronger interpretation, favored by Georgalis and Walter Freeman (1991, 1995), whom he cites with approval, it implies truly emergent properties that operate globally or at least at higher levels of complexity. (95-97) What a physicalist should hold to is not some ossified vision of physics, but the best physics of the day. (99) And if one accepts a chaotic physics, one should not expect all complex phenomena to be reducible to properties of their component parts. As a result, physicalism, thus construed, is compatible with irreducibility, and even renders it likely. (105-111)

I think Georgalis succeeds in giving a compatibility proof here, which is in some places all he claims. (97, 108) However, I take minor issue with several aspects of his view. First, he sometimes (e.g., on 106) writes as though he has shown that intentionality has been shown to be emergent from physical phenomena through chaotic interactions, when all he has really shown is that irreducibility is compatible with physicalism if the irreducible phenomena are emergent in this way. This is a large leap. If Georgalis's general picture is correct, there are probably many such explanatory gaps underwritten by chaos. But even if one acknowledges this, there is often an abiding intuition that the mind-brain gap is different from, say, the gap between descriptions at the level of single neurons and descriptions of the global evolution of brain states that Freeman likes to cite. There is an intuition that, in the former case, physics and neuroscience fail to provide even candidate explainers for the phenomenology of first-person experience. (Cf. Chalmers 1996, Horst 1996, forthcoming.)

Second, Georgalis agrees that the sort of physics-to-mental-state explanations available within such a picture would fall short of entailments, and holds that "to require that the relevant scientific theories entail that there are mental states is, to my mind, to set too high a standard." (101) I agree wholeheartedly, but only if the latter claim means that it is to set too high a standard for scientific explanation. Entailment also plays a role, however, in the role that reductionism has traditionally played in arguments for physicalism. If physical descriptions do not entail mental properties, then more clarity is needed on just what claims of "physicalism" amount to, to avoid the kinds of possible world objections given by Chalmers (1996).

Third, I would locate the seductive allure of reductionism, not so much in the first-order science of classical mechanics as in its metatheoretical interpretation by philosophers, from Hobbes and Descartes in the 17th century, to Laplace, to the Logical Positivists in the last century. The revolution I would point to is not that of contemporary physics, but of recent philosophy of science, including both case studies that reveal widespread failures of inter-theoretic reduction (see survey in Silberstein 2002) and philosophies of science that locate potential reasons for irreducibility in cognitive or pragmatic aspects of science, such as the idealized character of scientific models (cf. Cartwright 1983, 1989, 1999; Giere 1988; Dupré 1993; Horst forthcoming). These, to be sure, do not contain arguments for dualism. But neither are they compatible with a type of physicalism that is content to treat the posits of the sciences as fundamental (realist) ontology.


It is impossible to do full justice to the many additional fronts on which Georgalis defends his view in the space of this review. In order to discuss his central theses, I have had to leave out consideration of his discussions of representation (Ch. 5), Burge (Ch. 7), Quine and indeterminacy (Ch. 8) or "downgraded" ontology (Ch. 9). This is an important book, one which lays rightful claim to challenging the prevailing externalist, anti-phenomenological accounts of content and intentionality. In its critical project, it presents original and powerful arguments, some of which, at least, I find compelling. Its speculative side presents a new entry into discussions of reduction and physicalism. It merits the careful attention of philosophers working on any of these topics.

Works Cited

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———. Nature's Capacities and Their Measurement. Oxford: Clarendon, 1989.

———. The Dappled World: A Study of the Boundaries of Science. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1999.

Chalmers, David. The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory: Oxford University Press, 1996.

Dupré, John. The Disorder of Things: Metaphysical Foundations of the Disunity of Science. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1993.

Fodor, Jerry. RePresentations. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books/MIT Press, 1981.

Freeman, Walter J. "The Physiology of Perception." Scientific American 264, no. 2 (1991): 78-85.

———. Societies of Brains: A Study in the Neuroscience of Love and Hate. Erlbaum, 1995.

Giere, Ronald N. Explaining Science: A Cognitivist Approach. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988.

Horgan, Terry, and John Tienson. "The Intentionality of Phenomenology and the Phenomenology of Intentionality." In Philosohy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings, edited by D.J. Chalmers, 520-33: Oxford University Press, 2002.

Horst, Steven. Symbols, Computation and Intentionality: A Critique of the Computational Theory of Mind. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1996.

———. Beyond Reduction: Philosophy of Mind and Post-Reductionist Philosophy of Science. New York: Oxford University Press, Forthcoming.

Kripke, Saul. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1972.

Nagel, Thomas. "What Is It Like to Be a Bat?" Philosophical Review 4 (1974): 435-50.

Putnam, Hilary. "The Meaning of 'Meaning'." Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 7 (1975): 131-93.

Robinson, William. Understanding Phenomenal Conscousness. Cambridge University Press, 2004.

Searle, John R. The Rediscovery of the Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1992.

Siewert, Charles. The Significance of Consciousness. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1998.