The Prisoner's Dilemma

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Martin Peterson (ed.), The Prisoner's Dilemma, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 298pp., $30.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107621473.

Reviewed by Christoph Schmidt-Petri, Karlsruhe Institute of Technology


This book is the first in a new series by Cambridge University Press entitled 'Classic Philosophical Arguments', addressing upper-level students and academic researchers. According to the CUP website, the "volumes in this series examine [classic philosophical] arguments, looking at the ramifications and applications which they have come to have, the challenges which they have encountered, and the ways in which they have stood the test of time." To my mind, the book under review only partially succeeds in this endeavour as it almost entirely leaves out at least one area in which the prisoner's dilemma (PD) has been quite influential -- political philosophy. But before elaborating on this criticism, let me first describe the book in more detail and show where it succeeds well.

The book contains an introduction by the editor and fourteen chapters by a very impressive lineup of philosophers, game theorists and economists (in addition to those mentioned later in this review, the contributors include Jeffrey A. Barrett, Luc Bovens, Geoffrey Brennan and Michael Brooks as well as Paul Weirich). All chapters have been written specifically for this book. In the introduction, Peterson describes the PD (as do all the others contributors, each in his or her own preferred notation and with differing accompanying narratives), He also explains some basic game theory and the importance of distinguishing between single-shot and iterated varieties of the PD, and gives an overview of the book. I will comment on a few of the chapters but can't discuss all of them in detail.

After the introduction, the book, appropriately enough, opens with the fundamental difference of opinion the PD is famous for: in single-shot games, should the players 'cooperate' or 'defect'? The game theorist Ken Binmore argues (as game theorists almost invariably do) that in the single-shot PD defecting is the clearly rational thing to do, whereas David Gauthier claims that 'cooperating' may sometimes be rational (as some philosophers hope to be able to show). It is the tension well-exemplified in these two contributions -- the socially suboptimal outcome resulting from both players rationally defecting is either taken as a deplorable yet undeniable given or resisted with arguments of varying degree of subtlety -- that has rendered the PD such a central topic in the social sciences. It also provides the guiding theme of this collection.

By contrast, Robert Northcott and Anna Alexandrova doubt that the PD explains many real-life interactions and hence doubt, as does Binmore, that the PD is worth the attention it normally receives. They focus on an example in Robert Axelrod's 1984 classic The Evolution of Cooperation in which he (who might have been an interesting contributor to this volume himself) claimed that the behaviour of soldiers in World War I trenches could be explained with the PD. Specifically, he claimed the tit-for-tat strategy was a particularly compelling solution for the indefinitely iterated game. Because the duration of the war was unknown, and the soldiers were in the trenches for longer periods of time, it was possible for a pattern of cooperation to emerge between the enemies in just the way it (often) emerges in indefinitely iterated PDs. For instance, the soldiers mutually stopped fighting for lunch breaks and even altogether in certain 'safe' areas. This pattern broke down, however, when the commanders changed to strategies that could more easily be monitored so that the soldiers could no longer only pretend to fight. In their well-argued paper, Northcott and Alexandrova claim that the PD doesn't do any explanatory work here because it doesn't explain all that did happen (for instance, the retaliatory measures that were taken when the truces were breached) nor all that did not happen (for instance, that such truces only occurred with non-elite units), whereas close historical research may deliver a more accurate description of what actually happened. They go on to discuss psychological experiments and a number of further aspects in which the PD has proven to be of little value for the social sciences.

Daniel M. Hausman also wonders whether the game-theoretic models standardly used are too simplistic in ignoring a lot of the complexities of human mental life. Like Gauthier, who has developed a complete theory of practical rationality, he uses the PD as a starting point to illustrate more fundamental weaknesses in economic theorising. Hausman argues that games which appear to be PDs need not be construed as PDs by the players. As a result, even rational players wouldn't display the behaviour expected from them by observers who do construe the game as PD. Such cases are plausible if, for instance, monetary payoffs accruing to an individual are not that individual's only consideration in determining her preference ordering over the outcomes, say because she also cares about the payoffs to the other player to some degree, while the experimentator does not think she would. In fact, experimental results seem to confirm this is what often happens. So to the extent that game theory is intended to be applicable to actual human interactions, economists ought to pay more attention to how people actually frame PD-like situations, and doing so might require improving on simplistic assumptions about behaviour as well as updating simplistic vocabulary.

Two other chapters discuss directly related themes. Cristina Bicchieri and Alessandro Sontuoso examine how social norms may affect the choices made, especially if the players may communicate about them before the game. The paper by Charles Holt, Cathleen Johnson and David Schmidtz does the exact opposite of what Hausman suggests, taking any PD-like game to be a PD. They then conclude from experimental data, in line with Hausman's claims, that people cooperate rather more frequently, but, somewhat less cautiously than Hausman, they go on to claim that human "players do not act as predicted by standard game theory" (p. 244).

José Luis Bermúdez discusses the similarity between the PD and Newcomb's Problem (NP). He attacks David Lewis's claim that the allegedly imaginary NP is actually a run-of-the-mill PD. He claims that Lewis's assumption that the two players in a PD are so similar that one could serve as a predictive mechanism for the other effectively rules out the two outcomes in which the two players do not perform the same action. On Lewis's assumptions, Bermúdez claims, these are not "live possibilities" (p. 129), and so the players are not actually in a PD at all, hence the analogy breaks down. I fail to be convinced by that reasoning. As mentioned, the vast majority of people would claim that in a single-shot PD, using the usual assumptions, there is exactly one live possibility (not four), namely the unique Nash equilibrium. None of the other three outcomes are actually reachable; still, the fact that a game only has one Nash equilibrium certainly does not imply that there is no game. So Bermúdez's argument does not show that the game is not a PD.

Douglas MacLean's paper gives an overview of climate change ethics and discusses whether the Prisoner's Dilemma or the Tragedy of the Commons is a more suitable rendition of the underlying incentive structure. He also discusses issues of intergenerational justice such as the adequate discount rate, our normative relation to the future more generally, and the non-identity problem. The PD doesn't get the centre stage in this chapter, but it represents a successful illustration of how thinking about the PD may help to solve real-life problems. MacLean argues that in political decision-making about climate change, people's values, which naturally extend far into the future, rather than their narrow interests, which necessarily end with their own lives, ought to be the driving factor.

As mentioned at the beginning of this review, there is at least one paper missing from this collection. While obviously many papers talk about cooperation and in what exact sense there is a better outcome than the equilibrium outcome of the single-shot PD, none of them explicitly discusses its application to foundational political philosophy. Yet many textbooks in political philosophy use the PD to illustrate the condition within the Hobbesian state of nature and how the introduction of a Leviathan compelling the players to cooperate may resolve the dilemma (by changing the payoff structure and thus cutting the Gordian knot). Arguably, this is one application of the PD that works really well, and certainly it is the single most important application to the history of philosophy; indeed I would say it is the classic philosophical argument the PD most helps us to understand better. It would have been nice to have a paper dedicated to this topic, discussing strengths and weaknesses of the analogy, possibly linking it to the Stag Hunt game so prominent in Rousseau's theory of social cooperation and contemporary evolutionary game theory. Furthermore, given the book's stated aim, I tend to think that some of the papers are rather too technical. The paper by Bonanno (on subjective counterfactuals) and the one by Bicchieri and Sontuoso (which incidentally mentions the PD only in a footnote and mostly deals with empirical results on sequential trust games) are unintelligible without some prior knowledge of belief revision theory or game theory the intended audience is unlikely to have. Having said that, I would certainly recommend this book to anybody wanting to get up to date on the PD, and I am looking forward to the other volumes in this series.