The Problem of Affective Nihilism in Nietzsche: Thinking Differently, Feeling Differently

The Problem Of Affective Nihilism In Nietzsche

Kaitlyn Creasy, The Problem of Affective Nihilism in Nietzsche: Thinking Differently, Feeling Differently, Palgrave Macmillian, 2020, 200pp., $89.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783030371326.

Reviewed by Paul Katsafanas, Boston University


One of Nietzsche’s chief concerns is nihilism. Here is a partial list of things that Nietzsche calls nihilistic or associates with nihilism: Christianity and Christian morality; Buddhism; Schopenhauer; turning against one’s passions, affects, and desires; seeing the world as lacking purpose, direction, or meaning; seeing the world as having life-negating purposes, directions, or meanings; being dissatisfied with the world; being satisfied with the world while forgoing difficult goals; negating life; being indifferent to life’s values; inhabiting a culture in which the traditional values are beginning to collapse; and one could go on and on. As this expansive and apparently heterogeneous list indicates, there is no doubt that nihilism is one of Nietzsche’s central concerns. But there is a question about whether it is a single concern. Does Nietzsche have a single, coherent conception of nihilism? Or is the concept multivalent? For example, might Nietzsche simply use it as a term of abuse, labeling anything that he dislikes nihilistic?

Kaitlyn Creasy’s book argues for a unified interpretation of Nietzschean nihilism. According to Creasy, all forms of Nietzschean nihilism involve life-denial (27). Her task in this book is to defend this conception of nihilism. Doing so involves several steps. First, she critiques several competing accounts of nihilism, suggesting that they ignore certain aspects of nihilism (for example, she claims that Bernard Reginster focuses solely on the cognitive and ignores the affective) or are too capacious (for example, she critiques Andrew Huddleston’s claim that nihilism is simply having the wrong values). In Chapter Three, she introduces her own conception of nihilism, which treats it primarily as an affective phenomenon. Chapters Four through Seven provide a detailed analysis of the affective conditions associated with nihilism, an explanation of how these conditions can be understood to generate life-denial, a discussion of weak-willed agency, and a study of the connections between the cognitive and affective phenomena that are implicated in nihilism. Chapter Eight asks how we might overcome nihilism. This is an impressive work: it provides an admirably clear and comprehensive articulation of Nietzsche’s views on nihilism. Below, I will discuss some central themes in the book.

Let’s start with the title. Why does Creasy focus on affective nihilism? To answer that question, we need some context. In an influential work, Bernard Reginster argued that Nietzschean nihilism takes two main forms: disorientation and despair (Reginster 2006). Nihilism as disorientation holds both that values require some form of objective backing and that no such backing exists. This maps on to contemporary discussions of nihilism, in which nihilism is often associated with the view that our evaluative discourse presumes the existence of a unitary, objective moral order which turns out not to exist (e.g., Dreier 2006). Nihilism as despair is different: it holds that it would be better if the world did not exist. It results from the conviction that our highest values cannot be realized, where this is seen as a necessary rather than contingent fact (Reginster 2006: 28).

In a review of Reginster’s book, Ken Gemes accused Reginster of overintellectualizing Nietzsche’s concept of nihilism (Gemes 2008). Gemes writes that both disorientation and despair, as Reginster analyzes them, “are overly cognitive.” Nihilism in its deepest manifestation is for Nietzsche an affective rather than a cognitive disorder. It is a matter of the constitution of one’s deepest drives rather than a matter of one’s overt beliefs” (Gemes 2008: 461). In particular, Gemes argues that we should see Nietzsche nihilism as the condition in which the person’s drives are suppressed or otherwise blocked from their ordinary forms of expression. Put simply: Gemes claims that the conscious phenomena that Reginster associates with nihilism are mere symptoms of an underlying affective (or drive-based) condition. Hence the label: affective nihilism.

Creasy agrees with Gemes. Even the apparently cognitive forms of nihilism, such as the conscious judgment that life ought to be rejected, are traced to “psychophysiological configurations”—that is, to problems with the person’s drives and affects. She writes:

The nihilist’s negative judgments of life and this-worldly existence are based in negative evaluations at the level of her psychophysiological constitution (that is to say, they are based in her drives and affects). Most basically, then, Nietzsche characterizes a phenomenon as life-denying . . . when it involves negative judgments of life or existence that are either (1) generated from a negative assessment of life at the level of one’s drives and affects or (2) tend to produce a negative assessment of life at the level of one’s drives and affects. (28)

In the first sentence, Creasy agrees with Gemes: nihilism is a condition of our drives. And in the second sentence, Creasy introduces the claims that she will defend throughout the book: that Nietzsche uses the concept of nihilism to pick out cases of life-denial; that life-denial comes in two main forms (negative evaluations of life or degraded/weak wills); and that even the apparently cognitive forms of nihilism (involving philosophical theories, consciously held values, and so on) are traceable to underlying problems with drives and affects.

Of course, that raises some questions. Creasy claims that nihilism involves life-denial. But what is life? What does it mean to deny life? Nietzsche repeatedly associates life with will to power. A few examples: “life is . . . will to power” (KSA 7:7[9]); “life itself is will to power” (BGE 13); “the will to power is simply the will of life” (GS 349); we have mistaken “the essence of life, its will to power” (GM II.12). Accordingly, Creasy analyzes life in terms of power: “since life must be understood as will to power, the negative evaluation of life . . . is a negative evaluation of life qua will to power” (28). So when Nietzsche is assessing attitudes toward life, he is primarily interested in attitudes toward will to power.

What, then, is involved in denying will to power (or life)? According to Creasy, “Nietzsche calls life-denying any phenomenon that either (1) involves an explicitly or implicitly negative evaluation of life or (2) results in the degradation of the will . . . or the mere preservation of weak forms of life” (27–28). So there are three forms of life denial: having a negative evaluation of life, having a degraded will, or preserving weak forms of life.

Let’s look more closely at what it is to have a degraded will. In Chapter Six, Creasy distinguishes two forms that affective nihilism can take: drive suppression and will fragmentation. Drive suppression involves “either the global suppression of one’s drives or the obstruction of one’s strongest, characteristic drives,” whereas will fragmentation involves the “deterioration or disintegration of one’s will” (108). Will fragmentation can take two forms: “a disharmonious array of conflicting drives (N2a)” or drives that “neither conflict with one another nor coordinate (N2b)” (111). Creasy notes several places where Nietzsche associates this kind of will fragmentation with weakness, dissolution, and unhealthiness (111ff.).

I think these discussions and distinctions are extremely helpful. Creasy’s distinctions manage to tease apart some otherwise obscure points in Nietzsche’s texts. I agree that Nietzsche associates will-fragmentation with weakness, dissolution, and unhealthiness. Creasy’s arguments are completely convincing on those points. But now I want to raise a critical question: does Nietzsche identify will-fragmentation with nihilism? I am skeptical of that claim. 

One reason for my skepticism is that Nietzsche treats will-fragmentation as the default state, the state in which most of us live our lives. Consider a few relevant passages: “human beings have in their bodies the heritage of multiple origins, that is, opposite, and often not merely opposite, drives and value standards that fight each other and rarely permit each other any rest” (BGE 200); “our drives now run back everywhere; we ourselves are a kind of chaos” (BGE 224). And in GM II:16 Nietzsche argues that this inner fragmentation is part of the price of civilization. Human beings are typically fragmented. If we interpret Nietzsche as identifying nihilism with fragmentation, then it would follow that human beings are typically nihilistic. Yet this seems too strong. Nihilism is a pathology of modernity. It may be a default state in our age; but it is not a default state in all ages, whereas fragmentation is a default state in all ages. Nihilism might entail fragmentation, but I don’t think Nietzsche sees fragmentation as entailing nihilism. 

This brings me to a related critical point. Creasy associates nihilism with will-fragmentation in part because she wants to treat Nietzsche’s “last men” as nihilists. The last men represent a character type introduced in Thus Spoke Zarathustra; Nietzsche condemns them, treating them as contemptible, and seems to associate them with nihilism. As Creasy notes, the last men don’t manifest the first type of affective nihilism (drive suppression) So, Creasy reasons, the last men must qualify as nihilists in virtue of having a fragmented will. Thus, Creasy characterizes the last men as suffering from N2b: their drives neither conflict nor coordinate.

I don’t think it’s accurate to characterize the last men as fragmented. The description of the last men emphasizes three things (see Z Prologue). First, the last men have plenty of ordinary values: Nietzsche claims that they value comfort, warmth, happiness, mild work, diversion, lack of quarrel, and so on. But, second, the last men lack higher values. Higher values are values that are treated as inviolable, overriding, and associated with a sense of import or meaningfulness (see Katsafanas forthcoming). Examples given by Nietzsche in Z Prologue 3 include the higher values endorsed by Mill (happiness), Kant (reason), Aristotle (virtue), Plato or Augustine or Hume (justice), and Christianity or Schopenhauer (compassion). Nietzsche suggests that the last men lack these values and the emotions associated with them: reverence, awe, contempt. The last men find these emotions unintelligible, claiming that “formerly all the world was mad” (Z Prologue 3). Third, Nietzsche emphasizes that the last men avoid exertion. They do not struggle; they do not devote themselves to difficult ends. They merely “blink” in vapid contentment. 

These three features are connected: if you have a higher value, you will tend to experience reverence, awe, and respect; you will see devotion to that higher value as mandated; and hence you will be inclined to exert yourself so as to manifest devotion to that higher value, even when doing so is costly. In light of this, I take the defining feature of the last men to be their lack of higher values.

Now, let’s relate this back to Creasy’s point. Imagine a person all of whose drives are unified around the pursuit of a trivial goal, such as pleasure. Suppose that goal is treated as valuable but not as a higher value. So, the goal is fungible, isn’t associated with the emotions mentioned above, and isn’t associated with meaningfulness. This person would have a unified will (centered on pleasure) but would still seem to be a last man (cf. Shaw 2014). In light of this, it seems to me that what’s distinctive of the last men are the triviality of their goals and the lack of devotion—generated by the absence of higher values—rather than relations among their drives. If that’s right, then the last men needn’t manifest will-fragmentation in any form. We can make the last men’s drives as unified as we like, and without higher values they will continue to be last men.

So I think there’s another form of nihilism: lacking devotion; lacking great goals; lacking something to strive for. That said, it is possible that Creasy could analyze this as a special case of having a weak will: perhaps being incapable of devotion is one more way of having a weak will.

Let me close with a final question. Creasy’s analysis of nihilism treats it primarily as an individual problem. To be a nihilist is to exhibit certain affective conditions. While these conditions might arise in any number of ways, we can bracket the question of their etiology and their cultural setting and simply focus on the internal states of the agent. Just as you could diagnose someone as depressed or weak willed or masochistic without attending to their cultural setting, you could diagnose someone as nihilistic while bracketing questions about their social and cultural setting.

I wonder about this. If the last men are supposed to be emblematic of nihilism, then I don’t think nihilism is primarily an individual phenomenon. One central form of nihilism is the loss of higher values, and that is a cultural problem. Or, more carefully: I would suggest that Nietzsche sees two forms of nihilism, both involving higher values:

(1) Having life-negating higher values (examples would include Christianity, Buddhism, Schopenhauer’s ethical theory, Kant’s ethical theory, etc.)

(2) Lacking higher values altogether (examples would include the last men and, more generally, modernity after the death of god)

An evaluative community is nihilistic when it either operates with life-negating higher values or lacks higher values altogether. Both of these are communal rather than individual problems. It’s true that these communal problems will produce effects at the level of the individual’s drives and affects. That’s part of the problem with them. But these affective conditions are symptoms of nihilism rather than nihilism itself.

So, here’s the most general point that I want to question: I see two possibilities concerning the relationship between culture, affect, and nihilism:

Affects-first view: there is a distinctive affective state that we can identify with nihilism. Certain cultural circumstances make this affective state likely to arise. We can call these cultural circumstances nihilistic when they make the nihilistic affective state likely to arise.

Culture-first view: there is a distinctive cultural circumstance that we can identify with nihilism. This cultural circumstance often gives rise to life-negating affects. We can call these affects nihilistic when they arise from these cultural circumstances.

To distinguish these, consider the following case. Take a prototypical nihilist from the modern era and focus on his affective states. Suppose there’s an individual with an analogous affective condition in (say) Homeric Greece. Would Nietzsche describe the latter individual as a nihilist? (Consider Thersites from the Iliad, perhaps; or Eurymachus from the Odyssey). It seems to me not. Nihilism requires a certain cultural framework.

If I am right, we can imagine agents who exhibit exactly the same affective conditions (drive-suppression and/or will-fragmentation), one of whom counts as a nihilist and the other of whom doesn’t. This suggests, to me, that we should adopt the culture-first view of nihilism. How would this affect Creasy’s points? In the opening chapter, Creasy emphasizes that nihilism is a socio-cultural problem that arises in the nineteenth century. “Nietzschean nihilism is a complex phenomenon with socio-cultural, cognitive, and affective dimensions” (13). She says that as a socio-cultural phenomenon, nihilism is “the specifically European and Judeo-Christian denigration of this-worldly existence, either explicitly stated or implied by particular belief systems and ideologies” (12). So she does acknowledge an important role for culture; but her official analysis seems to focus on affects alone, and thus suggests the affects-first view.

But Nietzsche usually describes evaluative outlooks, moralities, or cultures as nihilistic, rather than people. (He does sometimes associate nihilism with certain individuals, but these individuals tend to be people who embrace or argue for comprehensive evaluative views. See for example, A7, which says that Schopenhauer’s philosophy is nihilistic; so, too, with TI Skirmishes 21.) An important form of nihilism is the loss of highest values, as I have explained above. The loss of highest values results in some of the phenomena that Creasy analyzes: depression, fragmentation, and so on. But I think it’s the loss of the culturally instantiated highest values that is explanatorily primary.

Moreover, notice that the loss of higher values can take cognitive or affective forms. For some individuals, the loss will be explicitly realized, pondered, and so on. Then it is cognitive. For others, it will show up in their practical orientation toward life. They won’t have the right sorts of valuings. All of their valuings will be fungible; they won’t be devoted to anything or, if they are, this won’t be seen as sensible.

So let me put my worry this way. Creasy criticizes Reginster for mistaking symptoms of nihilism for nihilism itself (as she sees it, Reginster focuses on cognitive phenomena which are symptoms of affective phenomena). My worry about Creasy’s view is analogously flawed: the affective phenomena that she analyzes are symptoms of a social or cultural condition, and it is really this social or cultural condition that Nietzsche identifies with nihilism. Or so, at any rate, I would argue.

But it’s a great virtue of this book that it puts us in position to draw these distinctions and to analyze them more carefully. Creasy’s book is the most precise, detailed study of the affective conditions that Nietzsche associates with nihilism. Even if I am right that these affective conditions should be treated as symptoms of nihilism rather than identified with nihilism, Creasy’s analyses of the affective pathologies associated with nihilism and life-negation, as well as her critiques of extant interpretations of Nietzschean nihilism are invaluable. Anyone who is interested in Nietzsche’s discussions of nihilism, life-negation, and his analysis of affective pathologies will need to read this book. It represents a major advance in the Nietzsche literature.


Dreier, James (2006), “Moral Relativism and Moral Nihilism,” in David Copp (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Ethical Theory. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 240–264.

Gemes, Ken (2008), “Nihilism and the Affirmation of Life: A Review of and Dialogue with Bernard Reginster,” European Journal of Philosophy 16(3): 459–466.

Katsafanas, Paul (2016), The Nietzschean Self: Moral Psychology, Agency, and the Unconscious. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2016.

Katsafanas, Paul (forthcoming), “The Fanatic and the Last Man,” Journal of Nietzsche Studies.

Reginster, Bernard (2006), The Affirmation of Life: Nietzsche on Overcoming Nihilism. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Shaw, Tamsin (2014), “The ‘Last Man’ Problem: Nietzsche and Weber on Political Attitudes to Suffering,” in Nietzsche as Political Philosopher, ed. Manuel Knoll and Barry Stocker. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter: 345–380