The Problem of Animal Generation in Early Modern Philosophy

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Justin E. H. Smith (ed.), The Problem of Animal Generation in Early Modern Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 456pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521840775.

Reviewed by Phillip R. Sloan, University of Notre Dame


The linking together of the issues indicated by the title of this book -- early embryology and early modern philosophy -- highlights the novel scholarship emerging from a new dialogue between the history of science and the history of philosophy. More unusual in this collection is that the traditional territory for this dialogue -- the interplay between mathematical physics and the philosophy of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries -- is here replaced by engagement with the life sciences, and specifically, with the interaction between philosophy and theories of organic generation in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries.

The effort to interrelate philosophy, intellectual history of science, and embryology is not itself new. It began with the magisterial Les sciences de la vie dans la pensée française du xviiième siècle by the late Jacques Roger, that formed his Doctorat d'état in 1963 (3rd edition, Paris: Michel, 1993; English translation Stanford: Stanford U Press, 1997). Professionally, Roger was in 1963 a literary historian rather than a professional philosopher or historian of science. This volume is the work of fifteen professional philosophers, with only one (John Zammito) resident in a history department as an intellectual historian.

Beginning with a useful introduction by Justin Smith, the collection moves through seven main units (my designations): classical Greek and Renaissance theories (James Lennox, Annie Bitpol-Hespériès); Cartesian embryology and philosophy (Vincent Aucante, Justin Smith); Gassendian alternatives (Saul Fisher, Andreas Blank); post-Cartesian mechanists and advocates of animal ensoulment (Richard Arthur, Deborah Boyle, Andrew Pyle, Dennis Des Chene); the Enlightenment controversy over epigenesis, vitalism and preformation (Karen Detlefsen, Francesco Paolo de Ceglia, François Duchesneau); Kant and generation theory (John Zammito, Brandon Look); and Kant and evolution (Catherine Wilson, Michael Ruse). The range of the papers indicates the richness of scholarly development of this discussion since the pioneering work of Roger.

Under scrutiny are such figures as William Harvey, Georg-Ernst Stahl, Albrecht von Haller, Pierre de Maupertuis, Buffon, Caspar Friederich Wolff, Charles Bonnet, and Johann Blumenbach, along with Descartes, Gassendi, Leibniz and Kant. It is exactly this engagement with authors typically dealt with by historians of medicine and biology that makes this a very important collection of papers. It displays the need for a renewed look at the historiography of western philosophy, and it suggests a rethinking of the issues around which the writing of this history of philosophy has been focused. As we see from these studies, major shapers of early modern philosophy stand within historical contexts that are not our own. They are asking different questions and reading a different canon of authorities. Fully accepting this fact, rather than merely paying lip service to such contextualization, leads us into some unusual territory. What does it mean for our understanding of Descartes, for example, to take seriously his claim in his letter to the Marquis of Newcastle in 1645 that the "preservation of health has been the whole time the principle aim of my studies" (AT IV, 329)? Or to think of Kant as concerned throughout his philosophical career with understanding the issues of organic generation as a way of dealing with the issues of materialism and mechanism, as is claimed in different ways by John Zammito and Catherine Wilson in this volume?

The puzzle of organic generation and the attendant issues of ensoulment, vitality, organization, and material reductionism, is a long-standing one. Related to this is the explanation of identity between parent and offspring. The opening chapter by James Lennox provides a perceptive overview of the importance of this issue for Aristotle and its relation to his dual project of narrative description (historia) and causal explanation in natural philosophy more generally. Aristotle had himself devoted such considerable space to the issue because it involved in some important respects the question of the origins of sensible substance, and this required some rationalization of organic generation within his larger metaphysical program. Lennox also shows in his analysis that Harvey's insights, both empirically and methodologically, were deeply indebted to Aristotle, and his influence pervades Harvey's own creative investigations of this problem in his Exercitationes de generatione animalium of 1651, the most extended text on this topic to emerge from the seventeenth century.

As discussed in the opening chapters of this collection, the pressing need for early modern natural philosophers to engage these questions was a direct result of the efforts to overthrow Aristotelian metaphysics and natural philosophy in the variegated way these were encountered in early modernity. Rejection of Aristotelianism and its conceptions of natural teleology, formal and final causation, and hylomorphic substance theory was central to the project of the new mathematical physics of Galileo and Descartes. Unfortunately for the ambitions of the "new philosophy," this rejection of tradition simply did not work in the "vital" sciences, setting up a dialectic between the physical and biological sciences that has persisted to the present. Jacques Roger's 1963 study highlighted the crisis that organic generation posed for this pan-mechanistic program. Further aspects of Descartes's response to this problem are dealt with in considerable detail by Vincent Aucante through a perceptive discussion of Descartes's struggle in his unpublished manuscripts to find some rational explanation of embryological development in accord with the laws of motion and his own methodological canons.

It can be argued that Descartes's failure to solve this issue -- to fill the gap left in the Principia philosophiae in the jump in Book IV, Principle 188 from mechanistic cosmology to the analysis of sensation in an already-formed organic being -- set up a cascade of issues for his successors that paralleled in its consequences his failure to defeat epistemological scepticism. Descartes's inability to provide a plausible mechanistic account of generation, highlighted by the ridicule that greeted the posthumous publication of his De la formation du foetus as an appendix to the French edition of the Traité de l'homme of 1664, demanded a new level of attention to these questions. The alternatives to Cartesian mechanism -- Gassendian atomistic materialism and various versions of this explored by Gassendi and his English interpreter Walter Charleton -- are dealt with in chapters by Saul Fisher and Andreas Blank. These atomistic solutions had their own conceptual problems not unlike those that faced classical Epicurean atomism, and as Andrew Pyle argues, they could not be made to accord with the growing body of microscopic data obtained from improved instruments by Marcello Malpighi, Robert Hooke, Anton van Leeuwenhoek, and Jan Swammerdam that seemed to support some kind of pre-existing microorganization. These problems eventually reduced the program of a thorough-going naturalistic mechanism to bankruptcy.

The important section of this book devoted to the issues of eighteenth-century preformation, pre-existence, and epigenesis supplies fine detail on the reactions to this seventeenth-century crisis. Andrew Pyle shows in his chapter how the new mechanists embraced the radical solution of theistic mechanism in the pre-existence theory most clearly articulated by Nicolas Malebranche in 1674 and 1688. On this theory, there is no true "generation" at all, only the enlargement in time under proper stimulus, either through sexual activity or by some other external cause, of a pre-existent and divinely created miniature entity containing all the rudiments of its parts. This "pre-existence" theory, distinguished in modern scholarship from the weaker "preformation" theory, claimed that the organism has existed from the first divine creation of the world, either as encased within the first individuals of each species in the sexual structures like a series of Russian dolls -- Nicholas Andry's theory of emboîtment -- or in the panspermist version put forth by Claude Perrault that drew heavily on the Stoic-Augustinian theory of the creation of the rationes seminales as "germs" disseminated in matter until the proper occasions were created for their subsequent development.

The three substantial chapters of the book devoted to the ramifications of the debates over pre-existence theory and the formulation of both mechanistic and vitalistic alternatives, form one of most satisfying portions of this book. Karen Detlefsen returns to the issues of the Haller-Wolff debate previously explored in detail by Shirley Roe in her foundational studies of the 1970s, and develops some new insights into these debates. On the Roe thesis, the intellectual fracture line that developed between the pre-existence theory endorsed by Haller in his writings after 1756, and the epigenetic theory of Caspar Friederich Wolff, was to be explained by external factors -- religious commitments and empiricist vs. rationalist philosophical premises -- rather than by empirical detail. Detlefsen shows to my satisfaction that the distance between Haller and Wolff on these questions was not that great, and that Wolff in fact held to a form of pre-existence theory himself as an explanation of ultimate origins. Their differences occur at the level of causal analysis rather than along the dividing lines set out by Shirley Roe.

The revival of vital agencies and a dynamic theory of matter in its many forms in the eighteenth century has formed a topic of some considerable scholarship in recent decades. The philosophical impact of this development on such issues as the emergence of facultative psychology and the "activity" of the intellect, made most prominent by Kant, is an issue that needs more exploration that I regret was not undertaken in this book. The important paper by Francesco de Ceglia on the Halle medical theorist Georg Ernst Stahl and the rise of medical "animism" in relation to generation theory provides an illuminating insight into some of these questions.

The continuation of some of these themes in the major chapter by François Duchesneau pulls together into a succinct discussion issues developed by Duchesneau in his major explorations of Enlightenment vitalism and philosophy, (La Physiologie des lumières, 1982). The focus is on the development of Leibnizian substance theory by the Swiss naturalist Charles Bonnet, detailing Bonnet's reworking of this into his novel theory of generation and organic development. Bonnet has typically been depicted, along with Haller and Spallanzani, as one of the major defenders of pre-existence theory in the late eighteenth century against both the "mechanistic" epigenecists -- Maupertuis and Buffon -- and the "vital" epigeneticists -- Caspar Friederich Wolff, Stahl, and later Herder and Blumenbach. Duchesneau details the complex development of Bonnet's views in relation to his assimilation of Leibnizianism as the main texts of Leibniz became available to him. The particular value of this chapter, in my view, is the detailed analysis of Bonnet's theory of the germe and the relation of this concept to the form of preexistence theory Bonnet eventually came to embrace -- a weaker version that did not imply emboîtment and that allowed many different forms of development to occur in terms of four different kinds of preformationism. This complexification introduced into the preexistence theory by Bonnet provided resources for several different exploitations of preformationism by subsequent philosophers, such as Kant, who was able to draw upon these weaker versions of pre-existence theory and move between the stark oppositions of strong pre-existence theory and vitalistic epigenesis.

For many historians of philosophy, the discussions of the book up to this point would perhaps seem of interest mainly to historians of life science, peripheral to main-stream discussions of classic philosophical questions. The four final chapters of the book, devoted to Kant and his relation to the issues of generation, should dispel this reading. Here we can see more clearly how the contextualized understanding of Kant in relation to the Enlightenment generation debates has the potential to alter standard conclusions on at least three interpretive issues: first, the traditional understanding of a sharp hiatus between the "pre-critical" and "critical" Kant, falling at 1770; second, the reading of Kant as primarily concerned with canonizing Newtonian mathematical physics and mechanistic explanation; and third, the presumption that his reflections on form, organization, mechanism, and teleology in the second part of the Critique of Judgment were latter addenda to the critical project rather than central to it.

John Zammito's magisterial article on the meaning of "epigenesis" in Kant's philosophy elaborates in historical detail on themes he has been developing in several recent papers and books on the viability of the naturalistic project in biology in relation to Kant's transcendental critique (see for an update Zammito, "Teleology Then and Now," Stud. Hist. Phil. Biol. & Biomed. Sci. 37 (2006), 748-70, doi:10.1016/j.shpsc.2006.09.008). This article displays with some decisiveness that Kant was deeply concerned with finding some solution to the problem of generation from his earliest writings, and that his later appeal to the "epigenesis" of reason in the cryptic passage of B167 of the CPR is much more than a loose analogy. This reinforces the claim that Kant's use of the language of contemporary generation theory at crucial moments in his epistemological project, such as the opening of the "Transcendental Analytic" (A 66), cannot be dismissed as mere metaphor with no significance for understanding his larger epistemological project. Zammito's careful exploration of Kant's reading of Pierre de Maupertuis's discussions of the generation question is illuminating, and it sets out clearly some of the pre-1770 framework of discussion within which Kant had originally encountered this problem. Zammito also makes very clear that the real discontinuity between the early and later writings on biological issues was not in a new "discovery" of biology in the 1790s, but in the insertion of the regulative-constitutive distinction to replace an earlier realism as a way of dealing with the antinomy of teleology and mechanism. From his more recent discussion (ibid.), it is clear that Zammito is critical of Kant's move, and that the constitutive teleology and vitalistic biology of Blumenbach and Herder, at least to the degree that these acknowledged the "ontological actuality of life" (p. 354), is to be preferred. This point must be argued out elsewhere between those favoring and those opposing Kant's "critical" teleology and his transcendental critique of biological naturalism. Zammito's chapter, taken in conjunction with his recent discussion of teleology, provides an excellent way to engage this issue.

Brandon Look's segue to Zammito's chapter further clarifies how the linkage between Kant and Blumenbach, made a centerpiece of Timothy Lenoir's interpretation of a Kant-Blumenbach "teleomechanical" program in biology (The Strategy of Life, 1981), has weak historical warrant, and that Kant really misinterpreted Blumenbach's project in his famous praise of Blumenbach at the conclusion of paragraph 81 of the CJ, again by diminishing the constitutive vitalism of Blumenbach's project.

The conclusion of the book with chapters on Kant and evolutionism reinforce Zammito's own arguments here and elsewhere that Kant could not have consistently endorsed some kind of species transformism. The efforts to draw more out of the oft-commented upon "daring adventure of reason" of paragraph 80 of the CJ are countermanded by the main thrust of Kant's transcendental biology. Kant's negative conclusion on a science of origins is argued for by Catherine Wilson, a claim I have supported myself (Stud. Hist. Phil. Biol. & Biomed. Sci. 37 (2006), 627-48, doi:10.1016/j.shpsc.2006.09.003). Michael Ruse concludes the volume with a useful and surprisingly sympathetic discussion of Kant's appeal to the notion of design and purpose in nature as creating an important conceptual framework, exploited by Cuvier, that dialectically provided a foil against which genuine evolutionism could be developed. Ruse's reading of Kant's project in biology is somewhat more sympathetic than Zammito's, even if he generally agrees with the negative conclusions on Kant's alleged late "evolutionism."

It should be evident that I found this a deeply engaging and important collection of papers. They highlight the need to rethink the interrelations of the history of philosophy and the history of the sciences, and they illuminate some of the distortions produced by seeing that relationship exclusively in terms of the physical and mathematical sciences. The book is carefully prepared and usefully organized. My one global criticism of the book is that in a sustained read, it seemed in need of tighter editing. There were several places where I regretted that more effort was not made to interrelate and cross-reference the articles to avoid a sense of repetition I sometimes felt when reading repeated summaries of the theories of Aristotle, Descartes, Kant and of the debates between epigenesis and preformationism. At the same time, this repetition allows the individual chapters to be read autonomously, which has its own advantage for use in teaching. This is an important collection that accomplishes its task of relating the history of philosophy to the history of science. In an era when the history of science has itself turned so strongly to the histories of institutions, the organization of recent science, and material culture, it is perhaps the task of philosophers, rather than historians, to restore to the subject a renewed engagement with some deeply interesting and timeless philosophical topics that once dominated the history of science.