The Problem of Animal Pain: A Theodicy for All Creatures Great and Small

Placeholder book cover

Trent Dougherty, The Problem of Animal Pain: A Theodicy for All Creatures Great and Small, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 197pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230368484.

Reviewed by John Schneider, Calvin College/Grand Valley State University


Trent Dougherty calls his book "a report from the frontier" (3-4), because so few fellow analytical philosophers have written on the problem of animal pain. The philosophical disputation over God and evil has indeed been focused mainly on human suffering, not so much on the suffering of animals. Michael Murray (Nature Red in Tooth and Claw, 2008) is the conspicuous exception, and Dougherty interacts extensively with parts of Murray's book. I suggest, however, that theologians Christopher Southgate (The Groaning of Creation, 2008) and Nicola Hoggard Creegan (Animal Suffering and the Problem of Evil, 2013) would have been worthy dialogue partners, too, at key points in the discussion.

Dougherty's book is unusual for a second reason: he employs a version of John Hick's theodicy of soul-making as a God-justifying account of suffering by animals. The conventional wisdom is that while none of the familiar God-justifying accounts of human suffering work to explain the suffering of animals, soul-making is uniquely unemployable, simply because animals do not have rational souls to "make." Hick himself stressed that his theodicy had no direct bearing on animals (Evil and the God of Love, 1966, 309-18), and others have generally agreed. Marilyn McCord Adams, for instance, writes that humans alone are meaning makers in the sense that soul-making requires (Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God, 1999, 27).

Like all good frontiersmen, however, Dougherty dares to defy convention. His main thesis is nothing if not daring.

I will defend the thesis that a class of animals . . . will not only be resurrected at the eschaton, but will be deified in much the same way that humans will be. That they will become, in the language of Narnia, 'talking animals.' Language is the characteristic mark of high intelligence. So I am suggesting that they will become full-fledged persons (rational substances) who can look back on their lives -- both pre- and post-personal -- and form attitudes about what has happened to them and how they fit into God's plan. If God is just and loving, and if they are rational and of good will, then they will accept, though with no loss of the sense of the gravity of their suffering, that they were an important part of something infinitely valuable, and that in addition to being justly, lavishly rewarded for it, they will embrace their role in creation. In this embrace, evil is defeated. (p. 3)

Dougherty devotes several chapters to creating the background against which to understand his novel thesis, and to see it as at least plausible on Christian theism, or perhaps even as probable on all evidence in a narrative or cumulative sense (46-51), in which even an imperfect particular explanation draws strength from other explanatory successes of Christian theism.

In Chapters 2 and 3, Dougherty gives his formulation of the problem that animal pain poses especially to Christian theism. In Chapters 4 and 5, he takes on the challenge of Neo-Cartesianism, according to which animals cannot be conscious of pain, so that there is no such moral problem as animal pain for theism. In Chapters 6 and 7, Dougherty explains Christian saint-making (his adaptation of soul-making). In Chapter 8, he explains how saint-making applies to animals, and in Chapter 9 he offers a defense of belief that God will include animals in the afterlife. I will try to convey a clear picture of the book as a connected whole, but will give more critical attention to Chapters 6-8. These chapters contain the main analytical core of the book. I cannot convey the many valuable nuggets of insight that readers will mine from various parts of the book that I will have to ignore.

In formulating the problem in Chapters 2 and 3, Dougherty seeks to show that indeed there is a serious problem for theism. It is serious, he maintains, because both the intensity and the proportionate amounts of animal suffering in our world, on a "commonsense epistemology," count as evidence that strongly appears to favor Naturalism over theism (21; 31-35). It is devastating for Skeptical Theism, or any theodicy, he contends, not to account for this evidential deficit (23). With this in mind, however, a preliminary word of caution seems warranted.

All the recent treatments of God and animal suffering mentioned above frame discussion by stressing how Darwinian science has made the problem far worse for theism than it has ever been. Science has greatly amplified awareness of the kinds (intensities) and amounts (profusion) of suffering by animals, especially during an unimaginably long pre-human planetary past, during which billions of animals suffered cruelly and (apparently) wastefully under the regime of Natural Selection. By not placing the problem in an evolutionary light Dougherty invites the objection that he has greatly simplified the problem, especially at the admittedly crucial level of the proportionate amounts and distribution of animal suffering in the actual world. I will suggest below that this methodological concern is fairly serious, because consideration of the evolutionary evidence weakens Dougherty's account of the world as a finely tuned arena for animal saint-making, and it also creates problems for his scenario of saint-making at the end. But first, I will give a brief summary of Dougherty's forceful critique of Neo-Cartesian theory in Chapters 4 and 5.

Neo-Cartesianism relies primarily on a theory of animal minds, according to which they lack Higher Order Thinking (HOT) that is presumed to be necessary for an evaluative consciousness of pain. The theory also stands secondarily on evidence in behavioral and neurological science. Dougherty begins by showing that for this theory to hold the arguments and evidence must be exceptionally strong, because the hypothesis that animals suffer has powerful initial warrant.

Dougherty appeals first to Aristotle's counsel of epistemic respect for the endoxa, or opinions that most qualified people hold as true. In this instance, almost all qualified people hold as true that animals suffer in ways that are morally important. People who are familiar with higher animals normally see it as obvious that animals suffer in those ways (57-61). Furthermore, there is a near consensus among behavioral and neurological scientists that this intuitive opinion is true. Dougherty provides a very useful list of scientific associations that have thrown their weight behind the commonsense opinion (61-65). He maintains that the case for Neo-Cartesianism falls considerably short of overriding our intuitions coupled with animal science. HOT is not necessary for consciousness of pain, which is "emotion-like" (78-82) and often non-conceptual (82-86). Animals very likely do suffer, and so the problem posed for theism is as serious as it appears to be.

But if our qualified intuitions coupled with a strong body of science are right that many animals are sentient, and that they really suffer, then a very serious problem for theism does exist.

In Chapter 6 ("Saint-Making Theodicy I: Negative Phase") Dougherty explains his adaptation of Hick's theodicy of soul-making to Christian saint-making. He begins by correcting a caricature of soul-making theodicies. Some critics have the impression that what happens in soul-making is that God merely compensates the victims of suffering with commensurately great goods that balance off or outweigh the badness of the evils (97-99). Instead, Dougherty follows Adams in employing Chisholm's suggestion that theodicy is doomed to fail unless it is an account of God not "balancing off" evil, but defeating it.

To defeat evil (according to Chisholm) is to integrate it into a morally valuable whole that is incommensurably better than it could be without the evil (108-12). The evil remains a bad thing, but it is also a good thing in that it contributes what it does to the overall great thing of which it is a part. We must keep this stringent standard in mind when assessing Dougherty's scenario of God defeating evils for animals at the very end.

Meanwhile, in Chapter 7 ("Saint-Making Theodicy II: Positive Phase"), Dougherty seeks to show that our world exhibits just the right frequency and right intensity of evils for saint-making. A major proposal is that a world ensemble designed for saint-making must include intense evils with some frequency -- suffering is a necessary condition for saintliness. But recall that he has to face the problem posed by the amount-distribution of suffering in the actual world. Is there not too much suffering? Dougherty ranks possible worlds, accordingly, from those in which evil is (1) "Too frequent and too mild" to (9) "Too infrequent and too intense." He declares that our world falls in the middle at (5) "Right frequency and right intensity" (121).

Readers will rightly wonder why we should accept this "fine-tuning argument for theism" (118). Dougherty's defense of the argument is anecdotal: "we find ourselves in a type (5) universe." Despite the profusion of evils, "it is relatively rare that evils of a stultifying degree occur," and that it is "quite rare for people to lead lives they consider on the whole not worth living (and of course it is more rare that they are right)." Dougherty concludes from these speculative judgments, on saint-making as God's goal: "so the facts about the distribution and intensity of evil favor theism over naturalism" (121-22). I will leave aside the obvious questions these comments invite about the relevant distribution of suffering among human beings. In these chapters on saint-making, Dougherty does not make the shift of focus to suffering by non-human beings, and the difference matters.

It is here, mainly, that we discern the methodological concern mentioned earlier: Dougherty does not place the problem of animal pain in the context of Darwinian science. His examples of fine-tuning all come from factual and fictional accounts of human triumph over horrific evils -- Viktor Frankl prevailing psychologically through the Holocaust, the characters of The Lord of the Rings coming through great tragedy to epic triumph, for instance (127-31). Evil is defeated in the examples by virtue of self-sacrifice that contributes vitally to the great goodness of the finished whole -- Frankl's sense of having acquired deep meaning, and the liberation of Gondor from Sauron's dark tower. It is the goodness of that sacrifice that becomes the raw substance of saintly virtue.

However, shifting to animals, in the planetary past, 99.5% of all species have ended in catastrophic extinction. Further, the existence of those extinct species strongly appears not to contribute anything necessary to the evolutionary narrative as a whole. They seem merely to be dead branches on the Tree of Life. Dinosaurs, for instance, existed forty million years. They apparently suffered with great intensity and frequency from infestation by parasites and horrific diseases (see Poinar and Poinar, What Bugged the Dinosaurs?, 2008), and they struggled mightily to survive for millennia -- but for what? The question is important. For one might account for the unexpected amount-proportion of languishing by some animals in biological systems, as described by Paul Draper ("Natural Selection and the Problem of Evil," 2007), by appealing to their God-justifying saintly sacrifice for the good of their own or other species. But the languishing creates the strong appearance that no such good for saint-making exists. The strong appearance is that their suffering is not morally connected to anything but is a function of brutal random futility.

At any rate, in Chapter 8 ("Animal Saints"), Dougherty proposes that God will transport resurrected animals into Purgatory (a resurrection is logically necessary on sentient suffering and theism, 145-46). Dougherty envisions an emissary coming to introduce each animal to its own life story, heard for the first time, evils and all. The animal is thereby given the opportunity to embrace its life on the whole, and if it does, the animal becomes a saint and enters Heaven (151). I will comment on only three of this scenario's numerous aspects.

(1) Animal damnation? Dougherty likens the scenario to the one in The Great Divorce, by C. S. Lewis (151). In Lewis's account, many people refuse to accept their biographies and in effect "damn" themselves. The comparison suggests that the same thing might happen to some animals. The sainthood is conditional: "if they are virtuous," then they will be sainted (153). God calls animals to make "a monumental decision of self-determination," and Dougherty regards being put in that position as a great "benefit" to them (150). Should we imagine God -- after all He will have put animals through -- forcing such a choice on them? The same goes for infants (Dougherty's comparison), who also would have to learn their life-stories this way. Would God force them to make a destiny-determining decision, too, or rather grant unconditional entry into Heaven to all innocents, non-human and human alike?

(2) Continuing identity? In a reply to Dougherty's thesis, Adams ("Deification and Animal Pain," 2013) objects that without "pre-mortem" personhood, or memory, the stories could not carry over into the post mortem realm in a way that animals could identify with. He replies: her objection seems worried only about particular occurrences of suffering, whereas he has global kinds of suffering in mind -- suffering of the sort that could happen is a world like ours (150). But either way, the stories of suffering would be secondhand and too abstract to be personalized and internalized as they would be for grown humans. And if not, it's hard to see how they could be the basis for the "monumental decision" in view.

On another level of identity, Dougherty does not discuss the vexing question of how predators could become non-predatory and still be themselves. Interaction with Southgate on animals and Heaven would have been a good way of engaging this question: how will the wolf lie down with the lamb and still be a wolf?

(3) Evils defeated? The accepted Chisholmian requirement is the defeat of evil. Chisholm and Adams see it as a matter of an incommensurately valuable, evil-integrating whole that victims will acknowledge as the result of God's goodness to them. Dougherty approves the criterion, and I think he's right to do so. But I came away wondering what exactly that incommensurately great whole is envisioned to be. Animals "played their role in the drama," they were "of use to God and fellow creatures," and theirs was a role "pertaining to the whole community of which the organism is a part" (150). But going back to the Darwinian context, we wonder how infestation of dinosaurs by parasites and by epidemic debilitating diseases, for instance, is connected in a saint-making" sense to a whole community whose great goodness defeats the evils endured. It strongly appears that there is none.

I am not suggesting that anyone has good answers to such questions, but Chisholm's criterion for a successful theodicy does force one to face them, at any rate.