The Problem of Evil: Eight Views in Dialogue

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N. N. Trakakis (ed.), The Problem of Evil: Eight Views in Dialogue, Oxford University Press, 2018, 233pp., $58.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780198821625.

Reviewed by Daniel M. Johnson, Shawnee State University


This book consists of eight essays, each summarizing an approach to the problem of evil, together with exchanges among the contributors. The authors are arranged in two groups. The first includes Eleonore Stump, John Bishop, Graham Oppy, and N. N. Trakakis; the second, Beverly Clack, Yujin Nagasawa, Terrence W. Tilley, and Andrew Gleeson. Each article is followed by responses from the other three members of the group and a final response by the original contributor.

In his introduction, the editor (N. N. Trakakis) indicates that his goal for the volume is to bring attention to approaches to the problem of evil which break out of the usual dialectic, which he characterizes as a kind of wrestling match between standard (Abrahamic or Abrahamic-like) theists offering defenses or theodicies and naturalists trying to pick apart those individual theodicies. (Some, though not all, of the contributors seem to share Trakakis's dissatisfaction with that dialectic.) So the collection leans strongly (though not exclusively) toward approaches to the problem of evil that somehow don't fit that dialectic: toward approaches that either intentionally ignore that conversation altogether (Clack), or rule out all theodicies as a matter of principle, independently of the details of the theodicy (Bishop, Trakakis, Tilley, Gleeson), or who think of the problem of evil as something broader or different than merely an intellectual problem for theistic belief (Bishop, Nagasawa, Gleeson, and arguably Oppy), or who propose meeting the problem of evil by adopting a non-standard (that is, non-Abrahamic) view of God (Bishop, Trakakis, Gleeson). This is also why, I think, the collection involves sketches of general approaches rather than detailed treatments of, say, specific defenses; the point is to compare big-picture approaches to the problem of evil.

I'll give a brief summary of each contribution and then offer some reflections on the value of the volume. (1) Stump summarizes her Thomist approach to the problem of suffering, according to which suffering is a necessary part of the process that can put people in a position to achieve union with God. (2) Bishop argues that the argument from evil is grounded in a more fundamental problem: when we encounter evil and realize that we cannot avoid it all, we have to cope with that in some way. That both leads us to theism (as a way to cope with evil), but then the theism it leads us to gives rise to an ultimately insoluble argument from evil. He argues that the best way to solve the problem is to abandon the "personal omniGod" conception of divinity, which need not result in outright atheism if we can develop alternative concepts of God that abandon personality or omnipotence or moral perfection. (3) Oppy situates the argument from evil within the larger clash between naturalist and theistic worldviews. He argues that considerations regarding evil just don't do much to move the needle one way or the other in that clash, since it is very hard for naturalists to demonstrate that there could be no fully articulated theistic worldview that has an explanation for evil. He thinks naturalism's advantage over theism is solely found in its comparative simplicity. (4) Trakakis defends anti-theodicy, which he takes to be the claim that no theodicy can be successful even in principle, since the very idea of a good that justifies God in bringing about evil is a morally objectionable one. His solution is not to adopt naturalism but instead to resurrect absolute idealism (of the sort defended by the Advaita Vedanta school of Indian philosophy and 19th-century philosophers like F. H. Bradley). If absolute idealism is true, God is not a person among other persons, and moral considerations applying to persons do not apply to God.

(5) Clack is very insistent on changing the subject. She thinks the whole discussion about whether evil is evidence against the existence of God doesn't help us engage with evil, so she wants to discuss evil in such a way that it would help us to engage with evil. She then offers a number of reflections on the conditions that give rise to evil. (6) Nagasawa gives an argument from evil against atheism -- or, more precisely, against what he calls "existentially optimistic" atheism, the sort of atheism which regards the world as a place worth being happy and grateful to be alive in. He argues that the fact that the world's evil and suffering seems embedded in basic systems (like evolution) is a problem for these existentially optimistic atheists, and so in a sense the problem of evil applies just as much to (existentially optimistic) atheism as to theism. Theists actually have an advantage in replying to the problem of evil, because of their view that there is so much more to the world than material reality that might factor into the balance of evil and good in the world. (7) Tilley gives a summary of his work arguing against the project of theodicy. He thinks that defenses against the logical argument from evil are permissible, but theodicies involve speech acts that obscure and erase certain forms of evil. He prefers Thomistic approaches that dissolve the problem of evil rather than replying to it with a theodicy. (8) Gleeson rejects any greater-good theodicies because they always involve putting God in a position to be treating his creatures' suffering as something he would be accepting in trade for other good things, which he thinks would be immoral for God to do. He thinks that "non-anthropomorphic" conceptions of God (such as, he thinks, those implied by the project of negative theology) avoid this problem, but at the cost of resulting in a God that isn't helpful to us in our existential confrontation with evil. He suggests instead that we think of God as much closer to a human father, with the imperfections that implies.

As both a reader and a reviewer, at this point I'd normally want to start some substantial philosophical engagement with the contributions -- to begin exploring objections, for instance, that I thought the contributors didn't have good replies to. But whenever I do so, I usually run into a problem. Here's an example. One of the essays that I found most interesting was the one, fittingly enough, by Trakakis. Like him, I would welcome the return of absolute idealism as a conversation partner alongside naturalism and theism. I have a longstanding interest in both the absolute idealists of the last few centuries and the Advaita Vedanta school of Indian philosophy. Because of those shared interests, I find myself very interested in Trakakis's suggestion that absolute idealism is able to handle the problem of evil more effectively than standard Abrahamic-style theism.

The problem that immediately occurs to me is that the various forms of absolute idealism themselves typically face problems that seem to mirror in many ways the problem of evil, to the point that it is tempting to say that the problem of evil simply recurs in other forms for absolute idealism. There are at least two such problems. The first is: if all things are part of one great mind which is omniscient and perfect in itself, how is it possible for there to be ignorance, misunderstanding, and hatred? How is it possible, in other words, for the one unified mind to be turned against itself, as it were? This is a generalized version of the problem that was pressed on the great Advaita Vedanta philosopher Samkara by his fellow Vedantan Ramanuja (who defended a view much closer to standard Abrahamic theism). Samkara's explanation for our mistaken view that we are in fact distinct beings was that in our ignorance we falsely imposed distinctions ("limiting conditions") between things that weren't really there. Ramanuja argues that ignorance can't serve in that explanatory role, because there is no possible subject for the ignorance. Who is ignorant? Is it Brahman (the Absolute)? No, because Brahman is by nature omniscient, not ignorant. Is it the individual self which is ignorant? No, because the individual self is itself a product of ignorance, and so cannot be the subject of ignorance on pain of circularity.[1] My point here is: this looks an awful lot like the problem of evil, and it looks like absolute idealism solves the problem of evil only to see it recur immediately in a slightly different form.

The second analogue of the problem of evil that infects absolute idealism is: it is common among absolute idealist worldviews to think of evil and limitation as a kind of product of limited perspective, which dissolves when one takes a broader perspective. For instance, there is some debate over whether Samkara thought of this world as an illusion. Some of his interpreters have insisted that he didn't think of it as an illusion, but it seems clear to me that he did at least think of our ordinary experience of the world (with its distinctions between things and its evil and suffering) as at least analogous to an illusion (though we experience the real world, we experience it wrongly), which can be defeated by the more fundamental and more real experience of absolute unity.[2] Western absolute idealists have typically adopted similar views: evil and limitation can be seen to be defeated by a change in perspective. But now I see a problem for Trakakis's project. One of the anti-theodical arguments he cites approvingly is the idea that theodicy can "trivialize and diminish the reality and horror of evil, and thus surreptitiously end up altering, if not disfiguring or destroying, our moral compass" (p. 99). But it seems to me that this argument applies even more to standard absolute idealist views of evil than it does to standard theistic views.

I'm tempted at this point to conclude that Trakakis's suggestion that absolute idealism might solve the problem of evil better than standard theism is quite implausible. But then I run into the problem I mentioned. Trakakis is careful to say that his essay is just a sketch, a suggestion of a direction for further inquiry. I imagine he did so in order to head off objections (perhaps even the ones I just raised) that he doesn't have space to respond to here, but that might have responses elsewhere. So now, it seems, I would need to read more -- perhaps waiting for him to publish a full treatment of absolute idealism and evil -- before I can press my objections with any confidence.

And now we've reached what seems to me to be the fundamental problem with this book. Five of the eight contribuors (Stump, Bishop, Oppy, Tilley, Gleeson) are in an even worse situation than Trakakis: they claim explicitly that theirs are summaries of approaches that they have developed in more depth elsewhere. Before I can evaluate any of the objections that occurred to me when reading these contributions, I would have to read the contributors' other work. But if I am going to read their other work, I didn't need to read these essays, since they are just a summary of the approaches they pursue in depth elsewhere. So I'm left wondering: why did I bother to read these essays when I should have spent my time reading their other work? Because of that, I found myself rather frustrated by the time I reached the end of the book. I found plenty in the contributions that interested me, but I found myself wishing I had just read the authors' other work rather than spending my time reading this book. And that would be my recommendation to those who find the descriptions of the contributions in this book interesting: instead of picking up this book, go look up the other work on the problem of evil by the author you find intriguing, and go read that instead. If you do that, you won't miss out on much; but there is a lot you'll miss out on if you just read this book and don't read that other work.

The glaring exception is the contribution by Nagasawa. It is an original and valuable contribution to the literature on the problem of evil that stands alone and doesn't just summarize work done in more depth elsewhere. I wish it had been published in one of the philosophy of religion journals, though, since I think that would have been a better fit. Trakakis's entry is not just a summary of work he's done elsewhere, and so it is more valuable than the five entries which are just summaries; but it mainly consists only in a summary of anti-theodicy arguments from other authors and a description of a future project (the recovery of absolute idealism) that he would like to see someone (perhaps himself?) pursue. It does not approach an even moderately complete defense of the claim that absolute idealism explains evil better than standard theism, and so it isn't really a stand-alone contribution to the literature.

Clack's contribution is also not a summary of work done elsewhere, but it really seemed to me that Clack just isn't talking about the problem of evil at all. She's talking about something different -- the philosophy of personal transformation or moral cultivation. That's certainly an important area of philosophy, perhaps more important than the problem of evil; but she didn't really give those of us (like me) who are interested in both moral cultivation and the problem of evil a reason to stop being interested in the problem of evil. So for those tempted to pick up this book because of an interest in the problem of evil, I think Nagasawa's article is the only really good reason to do so.

Is there anything else of value that I am missing? One candidate is the book's conversational structure -- if you just read the contributors' other works, you won't read the give-and-take criticisms and replies. Unfortunately, though, I didn't find much value in the exchanges. One problem with them is that the contributors often found themselves in the same situation I was in: they read the other contributions but didn't read the outside work that the other contributors were summarizing, and so they often raised objections to each other that the outside work had already addressed. So the final reply often amounted to "if you had read my more developed work, you'd see that I had already addressed or avoided that objection," or "I think you've misunderstood my position; let me explain it further." Once again, I'd have been better off reading the outside work myself instead of reading the exchange. Also, many of the exchanges merely involved people agreeing with each other, or involved observations that I had made myself already. What little I learned from the exchanges just wasn't worth the time and effort of reading them.

Perhaps the most valuable thing about the book is that it does provide an opportunity to try to take a bird's-eye view of the debate over the problem of evil, and to try to juxtapose a variety of approaches to the problem in a fairly short space. I'll finish with a reflection along those lines. One thing I noticed that many of the contributors had in common is a dissatisfaction with the very structure of typical defenses or theodicies, because (the thought goes) the very idea that God allows evil for the sake of some good (even one, as the skeptical theists might say, that we should not expect to be able to identify) would put God into an immoral relationship with those who suffer, because he'd be trading off their suffering for some other good, which would be an immoral way to treat someone. Those who endorsed some version of this line of thought reacted to it in a variety of ways: some wanted to rethink the personality of God in order to deny that he is part of our moral community, while others wanted to rethink the perfection of God so that we can think of him as an imperfect parent. I do think that this line of thought reflects a general turn in the literature on the problem of evil, from arguing about whether we can identify goods that outweigh and require evils, to discussing the ethical principles that would apply to God himself. I myself have most often encountered this turn in some critiques leveled by Abrahamic theists against other Abrahamic theists: the common argument against theological determinism, namely, that it entails that God bears some morally objectionable relation to evil and suffering, even if there is a great good that requires him to allow the evil.[3] The fact that so many in this volume see the problem as applying not just to theological determinists but to any standard theist is striking, and seems to me correct: everyone needs to address the question of God's own ethics. Unfortunately, none of the contribution addresses that question in any real depth, certainly not coming even close to the depth of Mark Murphy's God's Own Ethics.[4] So one useful lesson of this book is that we should try to explore the issue of what ethical principles should apply to God. However, we'll need to look elsewhere for a deep and thorough exploration of that subject.

[1] See A Sourcebook in Indian Philosophy, edited by Sarvapelli Radhakrishnan and Charles A. Moore (Princeton University Press, 1987), 549-550.

[2] See Eliot Deutsch, Advaita Vedanta: A Philosophical Reconstruction (University of Hawaii Press, 1969), chapters 2 and 3.

[3] See Calvinism and the Problem of Evil, edited by David E. Alexander and Daniel M. Johnson (Wipf and Stock, 2016), especially chapters 1 and 3.

[4] Mark C. Murphy, God's Own Ethics: Norms of Divine Agency and the Argument from Evil (Oxford University Press, 2017).