The Problem of Free Harmony in Kant's Aesthetics

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Kenneth F. Rogerson, The Problem of Free Harmony in Kant's Aesthetics, State University of New York Press, 2008, 134pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780791476253.

Reviewed by Mihaela C. Fistioc, Yale University



Kant claims that the experience of beauty rests on what he calls a "harmony," or a "free play" of the faculties of imagination and understanding, punctuated by pleasure. Famously, this free play is supposed to be "without a concept" (§9, 5:217-9; 102-4).[1] In his new book, Kenneth Rogerson argues that "only the doctrine of beauty as the expression of ideas gives Kant a plausible explanation of how we can see objects of beauty as free harmonies" (p. 3).[2] The novelty of Rogerson's approach is twofold. First, he argues that aesthetic ideas can explain not only artistic, but also natural beauty. Second, he stresses the importance of expression: both nature and art talk to us, as it were, and thereby bring about the free play of our faculties. Rogerson bases his solution to the problem of the concept-less harmony on a sharp distinction between concepts and ideas. Since his solution involves ideas rather than concepts, it meets Kant's "no-concept" requirement head on: "an artwork (or natural object) that can be interpreted as expressing an aesthetic idea will accomplish this expression via a mental state that is free of concepts and yet orderly due to the fact that it expresses an idea" (p. 3).

Here is a brief overview of the book. The first chapter, which is the most substantive, describes the problem raised by the harmony of the faculties, sketches the solution, and takes issue with competing interpretations. The second chapter details the notion of aesthetic ideas. In the third chapter, Rogerson argues against any purported aesthetical superiority of nature over art. A fourth chapter, based on a previously published paper, brings out the role of aesthetic ideas in explaining the pleasure that arises from the free play of the faculties. In the fifth chapter, Rogerson takes issue with interpretations of the harmony of the faculties which allow for everything to count as (potentially) beautiful, and tries to show how aesthetic ideas help his own reading avoid this danger. In the sixth chapter, another reworked version of a previously published paper, Rogerson takes up the moral relevance of aesthetic appreciation. An appendix, which is a reprint of an earlier publication, discusses the issue of universal validity, while a postscript updates the appendix in light of new research on the topic.

The Problem: Two Versions

In what follows I will concentrate on Rogerson's main thesis, since his other major claims rest on its success. To repeat, Rogerson argues that expression of aesthetic ideas offers the only plausible explanation of the harmony of the faculties (p. 3). Here is how he understands the problem of this harmony. The pleasure of taste arises from "a mental operation similar to cognitive judgments" (p. 8). In turn, to make a cognitive judgment "is to claim that an object (manifold of perception) instantiates a certain concept (the manifold is governed by a rule)" (ibid.). But, according to Rogerson, "Kant insists quite strongly that," in contrast to "ordinary cases of judgment," "the kind of 'judging' that gives aesthetic pleasure is not governed by any type of rules" (ibid., emphasis mine). Hence, according to Rogerson, "[t]he interpretative question that arises here is, How can there be a species of judging that employs no rules? One would think that the very notion of judging requires the application of some kind of rule" (ibid.).

However, when Rogerson comes to present his solution, he formulates the problem differently. As he puts it, "Kant has a solution to how a manifold can be both rule governed and free," where "free," he specifies, refers to the way the imagination is used (p. 20). In the more restricted field of artistic beauty, the problem at hand becomes, in Rogerson's words: "How can an artist create a work that is free and yet organized?" (ibid.). One can hardly fail to notice that, between the first and the second statement of the problem at hand, the language of rule-governedness has slipped in. It seems that by this point Rogerson has abandoned the attempt to show that there can be a type of judging without "any type of rules" (p. 8). However, he has not abandoned the attempt to show that the free play of the faculties is "without a concept." This is where aesthetic ideas come in.

Aesthetic Ideas

As Kant explains, aesthetic ideas are "rational ideas" [Vernunftideen] which the poet attempts to "make sensible" [versinnlichen] (§49, 5:314; 192). Some of Kant's candidates for depiction through aesthetic ideas are: "the kingdom of the blessed, the kingdom of hell, eternity, creation" (ibid.; these examples are quoted by Rogerson).

An illustration might be useful here to bring out the mechanism by which aesthetic ideas are built. Consider hell, or rather the kingdom of hell, as Kant calls it. We have a rough idea of it: it's the place of eternal punishment for the wicked. Our rough idea, perhaps a little more fleshed out, is the rational idea which the artist sets out to mold into the material of his art. And now consider Dante's Inferno. You see Francesca flying through the air, clinging to her lover in a desperate embrace, an eternal reminder and punishment of her sin.[3] Dante's account is the aesthetic idea (or perhaps the series of aesthetic ideas) which molds into words the original rational idea of hell. It is much richer than my dull description here, indeed richer than any critic has ever managed to put into words. It makes you think, and suffer, and go back to it over and over. It is Dante's own vision of hell, original and gripping. To get that vision in all its power, you have to read his own lines.

In Rogerson's view, aesthetic ideas are special in that they describe something which is "too big for ordinary empirical description" (p. 21), such that "no concepts can literally describe the notions involved" (p. 22), with the result that we do not have a "well-formed concept" of them (ibid.). All the artist can do is "stimulate the imagination to make all sorts of associations that substitute for a literal description of these elusive entities" (ibid.). So the picture seems to be this: we do not have a high-definition or line-by-line description of heaven, or hell, or eternity. Instead, we have a general idea of what they might be. So there's room for maneuvering here: the imagination (both the artist's and the spectator's) has a degree of freedom which is not there in the case of empirical concepts (or teleological ideas -- the other case mentioned by Rogerson; ibid.). In the process, the artist comes up with a new rule (ibid.). Most importantly for Rogerson's thesis, this rule is not a concept.

"Determinant" Versus "Reflective" Judgment

Rogerson opens his account of aesthetic ideas in chapter 2 with what he regards as perhaps Kant's "most explicit description" of such ideas (p. 26):

[B]y an aesthetic idea, however, I mean that representation of the imagination that occasions much thinking though without it being possible for any determinate thought, i.e. concept, to be adequate to it, which, consequently, no language fully attains or can make intelligible. (§49, 5:314; 192; here, and subsequently, I retain the bold emphasis as it appears in the text of the translation)

Rogerson thinks that this description is illuminated by the distinction between concepts (Begriffe) and ideas (Ideen) which, "in turn, gives rise to determinant or reflective judgments as discussed in chapter 1" (p. 26). If we go back to chapter 1 we read that, according to the first Critique, while a "determinant" judgment predicates a concept of a manifold on the basis of either experience (in the case of empirical concepts) or the possibility of experience (in the case of a priori concepts), a "reflective" judgment "predicates 'ideas' of a manifold" (pp. 7-8; my emphasis). So, in Rogerson's view, "determinant" judgments apply concepts, while "reflective" judgments apply ideas.

Importantly, Rogerson claims that "in the 'Critique of Aesthetic Judgment' Kant retains the basic distinction between ideas and concepts," with the addition that Kant now divides ideas further into rational and aesthetic (p. 27; my emphasis). There is no comment regarding any change in the account of "determinant" and "reflective" judgments, so presumably that distinction stays the same as well; there are no statements to the contrary in the remainder of the book.

Now this last distinction between "determinant" and "reflective" judgments is presumably the well-known distinction Kant draws in the third Critique between judgments which are determining [bestimmend] and judgments which are reflecting [reflektierend] (these are the English terms in the Guyer and Matthews translation, which is listed by Rogerson in the Note on Citations and Translations (p. ix) as the source for all his quotations except those in the Appendix; unfortunately, Rogerson neither uses the terms from the translation he claims to be using, nor gives the corresponding German words for the terms he does use).

If however Rogerson does have in mind the determining versus reflecting distinction, then his distinction does not obviously match Kant's. Here is what Kant says in the published Introduction to the third Critique:

The power of judgment in general is the faculty for thinking of the particular as contained under the universal. If the universal (the rule, the principle, the law) is given, then the power of judgment, which subsumes the particular under it (even when, as a transcendental power of judgment, it provides the conditions a priori in accordance with which alone anything can be subsumed under that universal), is determining. If, however, only the particular is given, for which the universal is to be found, then the power of judgment is merely reflecting. (IV, 5:179; 66-7)

A little later in the text, Kant states that "[t]he reflecting power of judgment … is under the obligation of ascending from the particular to the universal" (IV, 5:180; 67). So Kant's own text suggests quite clearly that determining judgments apply already acquired universals (in particular rules), while reflecting judgments search for a universal where one is not yet available.[4] As Rogerson readily acknowledges, Kant views concepts as rules for the unification of the manifold of experience (p. 7). With this in mind, the distinction between determining and reflecting judgments is not one between applying concepts versus applying ideas, but rather between applying an already available universal (in particular a concept) versus coming up with a new universal for a given particular.

This way of framing the distinction indicates that reflecting judgment concerns not only ideas but also concepts, and in particular empirical concepts. Indeed, there are passages in Kant's text which give good grounds to link reflecting judgment with empirical concept formation.[5] Rogerson does not discuss directly Kant's definition of determining and reflecting judgments quoted above, and he does not modify at any later point his account of reflecting judgment as restricted to the application of ideas. But the disagreement between Rogerson and certain commentators, such as Henry Allison, Hannah Ginsborg, and Carl Posy,[6] whom he criticizes for bringing the judgment of taste too close to empirical cognition (pp. 15, 18), ultimately turns on the question whether the judgment of natural beauty has to do with concepts or with ideas. This is why Rogerson, on pain of begging the question, cannot assume that reflecting judgment as a whole has to do with the application of ideas without offering an alternative reading of passages which, at least prima facie, support connecting reflecting judgment with empirical concepts rather than just with ideas.

Concept Versus Idea

As we saw, Rogerson's thesis relies in an important way on a sharp distinction between concepts and ideas, which he thinks goes back to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. However, if we take a look at the way Kant categorizes representations in the first Critique, we find that on Kant's view the distinction is not so sharp, since ideas are in fact a type of concept:

A concept is either an empirical or a pure concept, and the pure concept, insofar as it has its origin solely in the understanding (not in a pure image of sensibility), is called notio. A concept made up of notions, which goes beyond the possibility of experience, is an idea or a concept of reason [Vernunftbegriff]. (A 320/B 377; 399)[7]

So an idea, while going beyond the possibility of experience, as Kant puts it, remains a type of concept; it's just that, rather than being a concept of the understanding, it is a concept of reason.

But, one might suggest, Kant has perhaps changed his mind about the relationship between concepts and ideas between the first and the third Critiques. In fact this is not the case. In the opening paragraph of the Analytic of the Sublime, for example, Kant speaks of "the faculty of concepts of the understanding or of reason" (§23, 5:244; 128). Indeed, in the very account of aesthetic ideas, Kant keeps mentioning the concept of reason which lies at the basis of the aesthetic idea (the kingdom of hell, in my earlier example). He states, for instance, that aesthetic ideas "seek to approximate a presentation of concepts of reason (of intellectual ideas)" (§49, 5:314; 192), and that "genius really consists in the happy relation … of finding ideas for a given concept on the one hand and on the other hitting upon the expression for these" (§49, 5:317; 194; italics emphasis mine).

One might reply that, even if ideas are a type of concept, they are different from empirical concepts because ideas are indeterminate while empirical concepts are determinate. A problem with this response is that, for Kant, some ideas can also be determinate [bestimmt]. Even ideas such as God, which are clearly non-empirical, fall into this category: "[m]oral teleology," Kant writes in the concluding pages of the Critique of the Teleological Power of Judgment "leads to that which is required for the possibility of a theology, namely to a determinate concept [einen bestimmten Begriff] of the supreme cause as author of the world in accordance with moral laws" (§91, 5:481; 343). The meaning of 'determinate' in such cases seems to be not "empirical" but rather "precise, defined by clear marks." In this last example, for instance, Kant thinks that moral teleology can flesh out a precise and positive (as contrasted to a vague or negative) definition of God in terms of "omniscience, omnipotence, omnipresence, etc." (ibid.).

We have now seen evidence against attributing a sharp concept/idea distinction to Kant. However, Rogerson could point to Kant's claim, quoted above, that "an aesthetic idea … occasions much thinking … without it being possible for any determinate thought, i.e. concept, to be adequate to it" (§49, 5:314; 192). He could read this passage as saying that aesthetic ideas, i.e. what lies at the end of artistic creation, are distinct from concepts. But this is not Kant's view. It turns out that Kant calls a "concept" not only what lies at the basis of the aesthetic idea (the kingdom of hell, in our example), but also what lies at the end of the creative process (Dante's Inferno in the example); he claims that the achievement of the genius

requires a faculty for apprehending the rapidly passing play of the imagination and unifying it into a concept (which for that very reason is original and at the same time discloses a new rule, which could not have been deduced from any antecedent principles or examples), which can be communicated without the constraint of rules. (§49, 5:317, 195; my emphasis)

Rogerson actually quotes this passage, but only to scold Kant for being "rather loose with his use of 'concept'" (p. 37). Rogerson seems unwilling to consider that the distinction between concepts and ideas might not go the way he sees it and offers a revision of Kant's text: "[g]iven his distinction between ideas and concepts, he should have said genius is able to unify the imagination by use of a 'new rule' (idea) and without the constraint of 'old rules' (concepts)" (p. 37).

Indeterminateness and New Rules

It might seem that Kant is inconsistent, because he claims both that no "determinate thought, i.e. concept" is "adequate" to an aesthetic idea, and that the artist of genius produces a "concept" which "discloses a new rule." One way out of this apparent inconsistency is to take the concept produced by the genius to be indeterminate rather than determinate. Perhaps Rogerson would welcome this solution, since it seems in line with his expressed interest in the lack of determinateness displayed by ideas as contrasted to empirical concepts. Moreover, the notion of an indeterminate concept, far from being foreign to Kant's thinking, is something he himself mentions in another context: in the opening pages of his account of the sublime, we read that "the beautiful seems to be taken as the presentation of an indeterminate concept of the understanding [eines unbestimmten Verstandesbegriffs], but the sublime as that of a similar concept of reason [eines dergleichen Vernunftbegriffs]" (§23, 5:244; 128).

But it's important to notice that indeterminateness is only one side of the phenomenon described by Kant in connection with the artist. The other side is coming up with a new rule, and this is arguably the more important side. Here we've arrived at something which echoes Kant's main concern in the Critique of the Power of Judgment. As we saw earlier, reflecting judgment is the capacity to come up with a new rule and this capacity, more precisely its principle, is what Kant wishes to explain in the third Critique. We have also arrived back at the crux of the disagreement between Rogerson and other commentators with whom he's taking issue. As we saw, Rogerson does not acknowledge Kant's definition of reflecting judgment in terms of coming up with a rule. He also has an ambivalent position towards the role of rules in his own account. At times he allows that aesthetic ideas are rule-governed, but at other times he speaks of something vaguer, such as a "rule-like" harmony (p. 21) or organization "in a rule-like fashion" (p. 66). Presumably, the harmony involved in the aesthetic experience is not as strict as a regular rule. How could this be so? One suggestion comes directly from Kant's account of aesthetic ideas: the rules involved in the production of aesthetic ideas are not so hard and fast because they are just being crafted. The artist has just come up with a new rule which will only subsequently have a chance of becoming "exemplary" for others (§46, 5:308; 186). But with this we've come to concept formation, which is precisely the view Rogerson wishes to criticize.

If we accept that Kant's project is that of determining how we come up with new rules (in particular concepts), then the next question is: what is the best place to look for an explanation of coming up with a new rule? One would hope to be able to isolate this phenomenon and analyze it in detail so as to show what it is like and what triggers it. The work of the artist is a vivid and suggestive case, since it taps our intuitions about art. However, expression of aesthetic ideas, which is Kant's view of artistic creation, is not the best place to examine the mechanism for coming up with a rule because of the particular way in which Kant conceives of artistic creation. More specifically, as we have seen, Kant envisages the artist as always starting from a determinate concept of reason, and this leads to a couple of difficulties.

A first problem with the expression of aesthetic ideas as an explanation of coming up with a new rule is that the process of artistic creation is guided by the original concept of reason. It is also hemmed in by academic rules, an issue passed over in silence by Rogerson. But Kant is clear on this issue: he pokes fun at the "superficial minds" [seichte Köpfe] who think they will look more like a genius if they declare themselves "free of the academic constraint of all rules" (§47, 5:310; 189). In Kant's view, learning the rules of the trade is vital for the artist: "'[g]enius can only provide rich material for products of art; its elaboration and form require a talent that has been academically trained" (ibid.).

A second, and deeper, problem with artistic experience as an explanation of rule creation is that, by the time the genius comes up with a new rule, the very capacity of coming up with such a new rule has been already at work, and hence has been presupposed, both in the starting concept of reason and in all the concepts (whether empirical or rational) employed by the artist in building up the aesthetic idea. Recall that, on Kant's account, an idea is a complex concept. But a complex concept presupposes its marks, which in this case are simpler concepts. What Kant wants to figure out in the third Critique is how we can come up with a simple concept (rule) in the first place, so he would not want to start from the more complicated case of ideas to study rule production.

Not surprisingly, Rogerson resists the claim that the artist starts from a concept: "[r]egardless of how the process of expression is achieved (and Kant thinks here that genius is a mysterious gift of nature -- one which cannot be taught or learned), it cannot employ any "concepts" or teleological ideas (KU 5: 317, 194)"[8] (p. 22). But the text to which we're sent by the citation works against Rogerson's account of it, since it includes the statement that genius combines "finding ideas for a given concept" with "hitting upon the expression for these." A little later, on the same Academy page, we find Kant stating clearly that "what is called genius … presupposes a determinate concept of the product, as an end" (§49, 5:317; 195; italics emphasis mine). So I think that Rogerson misreads Kant when he claims that "[a]n artist, on Kant's conception, is certainly not self-consciously planning to create a work that communicates an idea" (p. 30). Surely Kant would agree that Dante knows he's depicting hell, and that hell is the place of eternal punishment for sinners. Nor is Dante unaware of the effect his story has on us: he actually wants us to weep for Francesca, regardless of how we judge what she did.

It would seem that coming up with a new rule is best studied in its simplest case, that is the case of natural beauty, which involves no preexisting concept from which one must start. As Kant points out, we can find even objects which have no signification and no use beautiful (§3, 5:207; 93). This doesn't mean that only those are beautiful, or that they are more beautiful than art (Rogerson worries that one may consider art aesthetically "inferior" to nature (pp. 43, 45-6)). Crustaceans need not trump Dante's Divina Commedia on Kant's theory; they just happen to be a simpler case (§16, 5:229; 114). And being a simpler case, they make it easier to identify the principle at work.

Moreover the parallel, and indeed kinship, between the experience of beauty and cognition explains why we engage in aesthetic activity in the first place, something which remains unexplained on the interpretation of this experience as expression of ideas. Consider the stance of the art appreciator. How do aesthetic ideas explain the free play of the faculties and the accompanying pleasure of this particular appreciator? Here are Rogerson's words: "[t]he person who properly appreciates a work of art (or, I would maintain, natural beauty as well) must be able to interpret the elements of the work in such a way as to 'see' that they come together to express an idea" (p. 21). But why, we might ask, should that person bother to read ideas off art objects or natural beauty? Why seek the secret message whispered by the Grand Canyon when one can go back to the lodge and have another beer? And why feel pleasure at grasping aesthetic ideas? Rogerson has a very hard time explaining this pleasure in chapter 4, which is dedicated to this topic. He claims that "[f]ree harmonies that express ideas are satisfying or pleasurable because of the valuable job they perform of expressing ideas otherwise difficult to convey" (p. 66). But why is this job valuable? Why do we care about those ideas in the first place? Here we're left with no answer. By contrast, the theory which links aesthetic experience with cognition has a ready explanation of why we engage in aesthetic activity: we approach nature with the presupposition that it is designed (the principle of purposiveness without purpose) because we are born knowers of the world and so cannot help but expect to find structure in the world. Not only that, but we are made so as to take pleasure in knowing, since pleasure is the positive feedback which ensures that we persevere in an activity which is central to our staying alive.

Closing Remarks

For all the reasons we have just examined, I believe that the book does not manage to establish that expression of ideas is "free of concepts." I also believe that the theory of expression of aesthetic ideas is only an illustration rather than an explanation of the harmony of the faculties. It is, however, a very suggestive illustration, and the virtue of Rogerson's account is to bring this illustration to prominence. While I do not agree with quite a number of Rogerson's claims, his book has forced me to reconsider my views on many issues, and for this I am most grateful to the author.

It is unfortunate that the book was not copy-edited properly; perhaps this will happen for the paperback edition. There are spelling and grammatical errors sprinkled throughout. Few of the German words which appear in the text receive an umlaut where one is needed: 'Jäsche', as in the Jäsche Logic, is written 'Jasche' consistently, including in the Note on Citations and Translations. In the same Note, the German title of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason is listed as "Kritik der reinen Vernuf." The endnotes do not respect the usual convention of listing the full citation for a book only once, at the first occurrence; hence certain books (but not others) receive the citation in full over and over. The chapters are repetitive and there is a lot of forward and backward referencing, which makes following the development of the argument difficult. Rogerson states in his Introduction that he has allowed repetition so as to make the chapters readable independently of each other (p. 5); but one can read only so many times that the Critique of Pure Reason is also known as "Kant's first Critique" and that the Critique of Judgment (Rogerson does not use the title of his official translation) is also known as "Kant's third Critique." Incidentally, a "first Critique of Pure Reason" (p. 60) and a "third Critique of Judgment" (p. 64) are also mentioned.[9]

[1] Critique of the Power of Judgment (Kritik der Urteilskraft, 1790), edited by Paul Guyer; translated by Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000). Henceforth the citations from this text have the form: §<section no> , <Academy vol no> : <Academy page no> ; <translation page no>. The book appears in vol. 5 of the Academy edition, while the First Introduction, which was first published in full in 1914, appears in vol. 20. Roman numerals refer to sections within each Introduction. The Academy page numbers refer to Kants gesammelte Schriften, edited by the Royal Prussian (later German) Academy of Sciences (Berlin: Georg Reimer, later Walter de Gruyter & Co., 1900-).

[2] Henceforth, all page numbers given in parentheses without further qualification refer to the book under review.

[3] Canto V, ll. 73-142.

[4] Kant's view of the relation between judgments and ideas in the first Critique is rather more complicated and is beyond the scope of this review.

[5] See, for example, (V, 20:213; 16), (VII, 20:220-1; 22-3), and (VI, 5:187; 74) in addition to the passage just quoted.

[6] Rogerson discusses, among other texts, Henry Allison's Kant's Theory of Taste: A Reading of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001), Hannah Ginsborg's "Lawfulness Without a Law: Kant on the Free Play of Imagination and Understanding," Philosophical Topics 25 no. 1 (1997): 37-81, and Carl J. Posy's "Imagination and Judgment in the Critical Philosophy," in Ralf Meerbote, ed., Kant's Aesthetics (Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Company, 1991), pp. 27-48.

[7] Critique of Pure Reason (Kritik der reinen Vernunft, 1781/1787), translated and edited by Paul Guyer and Allen Wood (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998). According to the usual convention, A and B refer to the first and second editions, respectively.

For the sake of completeness, here is the first part of the progression (Stufenleiter): "The genus is representation in general (representatio). Under it stands the representation with consciousness (perceptio). A perception that refers to the subject as a modification of its state is a sensation (sensatio); an objective perception is a cognition (cognitio). The latter is either an intuition or a concept (intuitus vel conceptus). The former is immediately related to the object and is singular; the latter is mediate, by means of a mark, which can be common to several things" (A 320/B 376-7; 398-9).

[8] Rogerson cites the Critique of the Power of Judgment as KU, which is an abbreviation of the German title.

[9] I wish to thank Sanford Shieh for extensive discussion and helpful comments on this review.