The Problem of Negligent Omissions: Medieval Action Theories to the Rescue

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­Michael Barnwell, The Problem of Negligent Omissions: Medieval Action Theories to the Rescue, Brill, 2010, 276pp., $154.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004181359.

Reviewed by Sandra L. Visser, Valparaiso University


Michael Barnwell seeks to solve the problem of culpable negligent omissions. In writing this book, he seeks to fill a lacuna in contemporary philosophical discussions. Because he doesn't find any relevant contemporary work on the subject[1], he considers ancient and medieval sources whose work can be, according to him, usefully appropriated to solve the problem. Thus it is that Barnwell considers Aristotle on knowledge, Anselm on the nature of the first sin, Thomas Aquinas on the distinction between negligent and non-negligent omissions, Scotus on the nature of the will, and Suarez on the operations of the will. That Barnwell selectively lifts various portions of each of these philosopher's theories, despite their deep philosophical disagreements, and then combines their insights together into one theory serves to reinforce Barnwell's reasons for considering medieval philosophy. Namely, his goal is to solve the problem of negligent omissions with inspiration from medieval theorists, rather than doing careful exegesis of their work. The central question when reviewing Barnwell's book, then, should be whether his theory solves the problem. As a solution to the problem of negligent omissions, I find Barnwell's treatment too narrow, which I take to be the result of his focus on the particular type of example he uses throughout his discussion of the problem. But before examining that assessment in more detail, I would like to consider the quite ample historical exegesis that Barnwell does in his work.

It might seem surprising that we should consider Barnwell's exegesis, since he explicitly indicates that he will lift his author's ideas out of context to solve a problem that they might not have even considered. However, Barnwell takes some pains to carefully interpret each of his philosophers. Unfortunately, it seems as though he is often not careful enough. Barnwell engages in some very careful historical analysis as he lays out his views. In fact, he often offers enough textual analysis to raise questions of interpretation on controversial points; unfortunately, he does not offer enough to allay interpretational concerns that arise as a result. As an example, consider Barnwell's discussion of Anselm. Barnwell asserts that Anselm holds a "strong conditional" for willing, one in which when one thinks about an object of an affection of the will, one has no other option but to will that object (76).[2] He offers one passage from Anselm which appears to support his position. However, in addition to its presenting a highly counter-intuitive understanding of how the will functions, the passage also runs counter to several other passages, for example the story of the miser in On the Fall of the Devil, and the discussion of how an upright will is tempted to abandon rectitude in De Concordia 1.6. A more sophisticated interpretation which took into consideration all of what Anselm had to say on the topic of the will, rather than just citing a few texts and concluding that Anselm was inconsistent in his views, might be more satisfying. It seems, then, that a more careful textual analysis is in order if one's goal is to get Anselm's view right.

Of course, there is a way in which getting Anselm exactly right isn't necessary in order for Barnwell to achieve his ultimate goal, namely providing a solution to the problem of negligent omissions. In fact, Barnwell has an easy rejoinder already in the text when we consider part of his introduction to his discussion about Scotus. Barnwell begins his chapter with the following introduction:

Before diving into Scotus's theory, a few quick words about his writings need to be said. Unlike other significant medieval philosophers, the manuscript tradition for Scotus's writings is very complicated. First, not all of Scotus's works are in critical editions. When I quote the Latin from a passage that is so included, I use the critical edition. Latin passages that are not included in critical editions will come from various texts; these will be indicated as appropriate.

More importantly, many of the passages I will refer to that are not from the critical edition are not necessarily from Scotus himself, even though they appear in the Wadding-Vives edition of Scotus's Opera Omnia. . . . In the end, it really will not matter for the purposes of this book who is ultimately responsible for the thoughts. The important thing is what the thoughts are and if they can (as I believe they do) help us solve the true problem facing us -- that of negligent omissions. (134)

Here, Barnwell goes on at length about critical editions, but concludes that it doesn't really matter whose work we're reading, as long as we properly interpret the words before us correctly. Similarly, in reply to my objections to his interpretation of Anselm, Barnwell should respond that it is the idea he gets from reading Anselm, not whether he's accurately interpreting Anselm, which is important since his goal is to solve a contemporary problem. I wouldn't object to such a reply. There's nothing wrong with finding something suggestive and helpful in historical works that will help us solve contemporary problems. And, if we claim that the ideas are merely Anselmian, rather than Anselm's, we do not minimize or claim more historical accuracy than what we've in fact achieved. There are grounds for doing good historical interpretation and trying to get Anselm (or Scotus or whomever) right, but there are other occasions when that part isn't as important as solving some other issue. But if Barnwell isn't going to take the time (and space) necessary to do really convincing historical interpretation, he's done rather too much. Either his book is far too short -- making substantive interpretations of important philosophers without nearly enough textual support, or his book is far too long -- taking too much time briefly discussing some historical fine points which detract from his appropriation of the material to solve the problem of negligent omissions.

And so, it is to Barnwell’s solution to the problem of negligent omissions that I now turn. His discussion of negligent omissions typically takes as its data how it feels when one has an obligation and how it feels when one knows that there's something she should do. And although in general philosophical arguments and positions do not make great use of empirical data, there are situations in which it is crucial that one's theory at least accords with whatever relevant data exist. To see how this matters to Barnwell's work, consider the use to which he puts Suarez. He unpacks Suarez's claim that the "will can . . . move the intellect confusedly" in order to appropriate that particular idea for his solution. Barnwell argues that this claim should be understood in terms of the existence of "a metaphorical searchlight that serves as the 'mind's eye' and which can be moved around 'confusedly'." Barnwell goes on to suggest that when an intellect is working appropriately it will "jiggle" the searchlight around in order to discover any relevant information concerning a particular action (or whether there is some action that one is obligated to perform). Metaphors have their place, but one's theory of action and one's theory of belief or cognitive function should not rest so heavily on a metaphor. Although one cannot ask Barnwell to give an entire theory of mind, it still seems that there should be some attention to whether it is possible for the brain to work in such a "jiggly" way. Whether one believes that the mind is the brain or not, the brain is going to play a major role in intellection and so must be responsive to the will, whatever the will is. Thus, at least a perfunctory nod to contemporary scientific work in the area seems appropriate.

Barnwell's arguments call out even more strongly for such empirical evidence when he gives his final theory about when an omission is negligent. His theory requires that sometimes a person must keep an obligation in mind continuously. But he doesn't consider whether that obligation might conflict with some other obligation the person has. I think that Barnwell neglects to consider this possibility because of his primary example, which is one in which one person has promised to pick another up from the airport (for which she much leave in five or ten minutes), but then forgets while watching a movie on television. It might seem reasonable that such a promise might require that the promisor keep the obligation in the forefront of her mind for that amount of time. But perhaps the person who made the promise needed to be attending to something more important than a movie watched for pleasure. In that case, it might not be possible to keep the promise in mind while performing the other action without compromising the other action. That is, given what current research has told us about multitasking (namely, that humans are really bad at it), we might not be able to keep any such obligation in mind without sacrificing part of our concentration on another event. Because Barnwell focuses so closely on his one example, he forces the reader to figure out what adjustments must be made in a case with relevant differences.

In fact, Barnwell's entire essay unpacks each issue in terms of his particular example, which has two specific features that not all cases of negligent omission share: that each obligation we acquire takes place at a particular time, which is true of promises, but not true of the sorts of obligations that arise as a result of academic research, or parenting, or marriage, etc. Further, his example includes fairly precise temporal boundaries, something that not all obligations share. Admittedly, Barnwell offers a brief discussion of such situations, and how those examples could be understood to meet his requirements, but that just indicates that his solution is stated too narrowly. His solution should require that each example require translation into the preferred form in order to be applied.

In order for his case to work, Barnwell needs to equate the feeling that "I must do something" to the knowledge that "I have an obligation to do something." But I imagine that one of the reasons we are negligent is that we know that such an identification doesn't always hold. Consider a partial list of items that have prompted me to have the "I need to do something" feeling recently: move the laundry from the washer to the dryer, get the oil changed in my car before the coupon expired, pick up celery and bell peppers on the way home from work, pick up the kids from school early. It appears to me that I only had an obligation to do only one of those things in a timely fashion -- i.e., a fashion such that I would have violated an obligation if I had ignored the feeling. Indeed, the laundry has stayed inconveniently wet on more than one occasion, I am embarrassed to write. But one of the reasons we don't attend to the internal bell consistently is that so much of the time that feeling flags something relatively unimportant. There isn't always a different feeling when the "must do" is more important. When considering my list, I cannot report a difference among the "must do" twinges. Perhaps I am an outlier. Perhaps I misremember my twinges.

To decide who is right, it seems that we might be able to appeal to empirical research on memory. But that is precisely what Barnwell has neglected to do. Was his negligence culpable? I think so, but I don't know when his knowledge of the state of scientific discovery would have been activated, and I surely know of no note he could have written to himself. But according to his theory, there was some intellection that he had that yields the result that his failure to consider empirical data was negligent. What sort of intellection could he have had? I can suggest several kinds, but what's odd about his theory is that it will suggest that he would have had to have one of a very wide variety of intellections. It's not clear to me that Barnwell has offered evidence that such an intellection would have occurred. I think that Barnwell has shown that it is possible that we might sometimes have a particular type of intellection, and that having such an intellection would be sufficient for negligent omissions to be culpable, but he has not shown that that very type of intellection is necessary for the culpability of a negligent omission.

[1] George Sher's recent book, Who Knew? Responsibility Without Awareness, Oxford University Press (2009), appears to be relevant to Barnwell's project.

[2] Barnwell's explanation still needs one more step. His own illustration of the principle is that if one considers health, then one wills to be healthy. But merely willing to be healthy doesn't result in any particular action. Anselm himself uses more concrete examples. In a case when deciding whether to preserve one's life by lying, one wills justice, doesn't lie, and then dies, or one wills happiness, lies, and in so doing, forsakes justice. So we should understand an example like "willing to be healthy" only in light of a particular situation as being the overriding concern when one is deciding whether to eat an item of food high in calories and saturated fat.

One might note that although Barnwell is working on a contemporary problem, because he's using medieval sources his terminology and concepts tend to be familiar only for those with some exposure to medieval philosophy. While he carefully explains each of the concepts to the reader, so that one unfamiliar with medieval philosophy can profitably read the book, in the end he states his theory using medieval concepts and language instead of finding a way to express his theory using language contemporary philosophers would find clear and easy to understand without explanation.