The Problem of Punishment

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David Boonin, The Problem of Punishment, Cambridge UP, 2008, 299pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521709613.

Reviewed by Jim Staihar, University of Chicago Law School



When someone commits a crime, we usually assume the state is morally permitted to punish her. Our assumption, though, needs justification: punishing someone involves intentionally harming her, and people have a prima facie right not to be intentionally harmed against their will. In The Problem of Punishment, David Boonin critically examines a wide range of theories that purport to explain why the state is morally permitted to punish criminals. Boonin argues that none succeeds. In response, he endorses abolitionism, the view that the entire practice of punishing criminals should be abolished because it is morally impermissible. He argues that the state could ensure the minimum conditions necessary for just mutual relations between its citizens by relying on a practice of pure restitution instead of punishment.

The book contains five chapters. In the first, Boonin defines the notion of legal punishment the justification of which is at issue. The problem of punishment is to explain why state officials are morally permitted intentionally to harm people who violate just and reasonable laws. He contends that a successful solution to the problem must pass two tests. Under the foundational test, a solution must rest on only morally acceptable principles. Under the entailment test, a solution must establish the moral permissibility of punishing offenders and the moral impermissibility of punishing non-offenders.

Boonin classifies the solutions he considers as consequentialist, retributivist, or a distinct third type. In chapter two, he examines consequentialist solutions. He focuses primarily on act-utilitarianism and the rule-utilitarian theory John Rawls defends in “Two Concepts of Rules”. According to these theories, the practice of punishment is justified solely in terms of the values it promotes. They assume that crime prevention is the main benefit of punishing criminals, and that punishing them promotes this value mainly through deterrence and incapacitation. Boonin argues that the objections to act- and rule-utilitarianism also apply to other types of utilitarianism, such as motive-utilitarianism, and to any non-utilitarian conception of consequentialism, like one that places value on people’s getting what they deserve.

In chapter three, Boonin considers several retributive theories. According to Boonin, these theories claim that criminals are liable to punishment independently of whether punishing them would have good further effects (85). He first considers a desert-based theory that attempts to justify punishment on the grounds that criminals deserve to be punished in the sense that punishing them would be intrinsically good. Next he discusses a forfeiture-based theory which tries to show that when a criminal violates a right of others, she forfeits either the same right or an equivalent set of rights in herself. As a consequence, these theorists infer that criminals forfeit their right to be free from punishment. Boonin then engages some fairness-based theories, according to which criminals are liable to punishment because punishing them is necessary to remove an unfair advantage that they obtained over law-abiding citizens by committing their crimes. In the chapter’s final part, he briefly discusses three theories grounded in considerations of trust, moral debts, and revenge.

In chapter four, Boonin examines several theories that he classifies as neither consequentialist nor retributivist. According to a consent-based theory, criminals actually consent to waive their rights to be free from punishment. A reprobative theory claims that criminals are liable to punishment because punishing them is necessary to express or communicate a warranted attitude of moral disapproval toward them. A moral education theory contends that criminals are liable to be punished because punishments are good for them, since punishment is necessary to rectify a moral defect in their character. According to a self-defense theory, the state has the right to punish criminals because, on grounds of self-defense, it has the right to threaten to punish those who commit crimes. Lastly, Boonin considers the prospects of constructing a plausible hybrid solution that might combine elements from some of the previous theories.

Drawing on the critical work of others, Boonin argues that each of the above theories is open to all or many of the following objections. First, some rest on assumptions that are unacceptable independently of what they imply about the justification of punishment. Second, the theories unacceptably entail that some innocent people may be punished. Third, they unacceptably entail that some guilty people may not be punished. A guilty person has, whereas an innocent person has not, violated a just and reasonable law. Fourth, the theories cannot account for the proportionality of punishment. They cannot explain why criminals may be punished more severely for committing more serious crimes, and they cannot account for the absolute severity of the punishments that criminals may receive. Fifth, the theories cannot explain the mitigating effects of excuses on how much criminals may be punished. Examples include duress and provocation. Sixth, they cannot account for the exclusivity of the state’s authority to punish. They cannot explain why the state is, but private citizens are not, morally permitted to punish criminals. Seventh, even if the theories can explain why the state may subject criminals to harmful treatment, they cannot explain why the state may intentionally harm them. At best, they can explain only why the state may subject criminals to treatment that is foreseeably harmful. Punishment, though, involves intentional harm.

In the final chapter, Boonin argues that the practice of punishing criminals is not necessary for maintaining just mutual relations among people. A practice of pure restitution would suffice. Under such a practice, the state would compel a criminal to compensate his victims for the harm he wrongfully caused them. The compensation could take a variety of monetary or non-monetary forms, including a payment of money or labor-intensive community service. A practice of pure restitution could prevent crimes through incapacitation, moral education, and deterrence. For example, the practice is consistent with incapacitating criminals who are deemed sufficiently dangerous. The practice could express or communicate moral blame toward criminals, and it could help them rectify moral defects in their character. The practice could also deter crimes because it could be burdensome for criminals to provide compensation. Unlike punishment, however, pure restitution would not intentionally harm criminals. Any harm would be merely foreseen.

In assessment, Boonin provides an excellent, thorough account of the concept of punishment. He critically engages in great depth a wide range of theories that purport to explain why the practice of punishment is morally permissible. For the most part, he describes each theory accurately although at times uncharitably. For example, he attributes to unfair advantage theorists the claim that the state may punish someone merely because punishing her would bring about a fairer overall distribution of benefits and burdens in the world (140). He then points out that this agent-neutral goal would unacceptably permit punishing the innocent when doing so is necessary to apprehend and punish several criminals (140). In fact, no unfair advantage theorist, such as Herbert Morris or Jeffrie Murphy, has endorsed or is committed to endorsing such an agent-neutral principle. They endorse the agent-relative principle that the state may punish a criminal to remove the unfair advantage that she obtained over law-abiding citizens by committing her crime.

Given the book’s many virtues, I will briefly make some critical comments on Boonin’s analysis. He pays insufficient attention to the plurality of conditions that a punishment must satisfy to be considered justified. To be justified, a punishment must be deserved in the minimal sense that it does not violate the rights of the person who receives it (Garcia 219-24). In addition to being deserved, a justified punishment must also satisfy a value requirement: its consequences must be at least as good as the consequences of any other available act that would not violate anyone’s rights. In light of the desert and value requirements, Boonin should make more explicit the different routes that one could take in defending abolitionism. On the one hand, abolitionists might argue that punishments are never deserved: punishing criminals would always violate their rights. On the other hand, even if punishments can be deserved, abolitionists might argue that the consequences of the practice of punishment are, all things considered, worse than the consequences of an alternative practice that would not violate anyone’s rights, like a practice of pure restitution. Boonin seems sympathetic to both arguments, but he does not distinguish between them clearly.

Once we distinguish between the desert and value requirements, it is clear that some of Boonin’s objections to some theories are weak. Consider the not-punishing-the-guilty objection, which he raises against almost every theory he considers. Boonin rejects any proposed solution to the problem of punishment if it cannot explain why the state is justified in punishing everyone who violates a just and reasonable law (53-54). Pace Kant, however, no sensible defender of punishment asserts such a categorical claim. For the consequences of punishing some criminals would be, all things considered, worse than the consequences of not punishing them. Consider plea bargains, where a prosecutor grants a defendant immunity to punishment in exchange for her testimony against more serious criminals. Alternately, consider the decisions to pardon Richard Nixon and not to prosecute Tawana Brawley because punishing them would have been bad for the country even though both arguably committed crimes (Husak 448-49).

Thus, the not-punishing-the-guilty objection is strong only if a theory entails that some criminals do not deserve to be punished for violating a just and reasonable law. Even here, though, we need to distinguish between core crimes that are mala in se and non-core crimes that are mala prohibita. Core crimes involve disrespecting the rights of others. They include murder, assault, theft, and fraud. Examples of non-core crimes include public welfare offenses, drug offenses, traffic violations, and crimes of mere negligence. Whether non-core crimes deserve to be punished is very controversial, and even if they do, the reason could be quite different from the reason core crimes deserve punishment. In response, defenders of punishment standardly focus on explaining only why core crimes deserve to be punished; the issue of non-core crimes is left open. Hence the not-punishing-the-guilty objection is strong only if a theory cannot explain why core crimes deserve to be punished when committed with no exculpatory defenses.

Unfortunately, Boonin’s arguments in support of the objection sometimes involve non-core crimes committed with a defense. For example, he rejects some theories because they cannot explain why the state would be justified in punishing someone for driving an injured friend to the emergency room in the following two cases. In one, the person drives the friend in a car that has not passed an emissions test (94). In the other, the person steals a car to drive the friend under conditions in which “the friend will otherwise die and the owner of the car will not be significantly harmed by the theft” (94). The first case does not involve a core crime, and both seem to involve a defense of necessity. Thus a just and reasonable legal system would not prohibit the theft or the act of driving in either case.

Some of Boonin’s arguments in support of the punishing-the-innocent objection are also questionable. If a theory entails that the state may punish someone who has not committed any immoral or illegal acts, then the theory is unacceptable. Unfortunately, Boonin also rejects theories because they do not explain why the state is forbidden from punishing someone who has committed an immoral act that was not legally prohibited at the time of the act (99-101). This objection is weak for two reasons. First, the principle against punishing immoral non-offenders is controversial in scope. Consider Nazis who committed acts of genocide while they were legally permitted. Alternately, consider a coup d’état, where the usurpers commit acts of genocide after suspending the rule of law upon overthrowing the prior government. Arguably, such immoral non-offenders should be punished for their acts of genocide.

Second, even if there is a robust principle against punishing immoral non-offenders, its justification might be grounded in considerations that are external to the non-consequentialist theories Boonin criticizes. The primary aim of these theories is to explain why punishing criminals would not violate their substantive rights if they performed acts in which they disrespected the rights of others with no exculpatory defenses. The theories do not purport to explain all the conditions that must obtain for a punishment to be all things considered justified. Hence, external considerations of procedural rights, third party rights, and general utility might underlie the principle against punishing immoral non-offenders. For example, consider defamation, such as libel and slander, which are usually treated as mere torts rather than crimes. Although people who commit defamation might deserve punishment, punishing them would likely have a chilling effect on others’ freedom of expression. So considerations of third party rights and general utility usually entail that defamation all things considered should not be punished even though it is immoral (Hampton 1700).

In addition, there are many procedural rights that the state should respect before punishing someone. For example, defendants have a right against double jeopardy, a right to a jury trial, a right to counsel, a right to confront witnesses, and so forth. However, the justification of these procedural rights is not within the scope of the relevant theories. Boonin ignores the possibility that the principle against punishing immoral non-offenders also embodies a procedural right the justification of which is external to the theories under review. There is a related problem with Boonin’s decision to reject theories because they cannot account for the exclusivity of the state’s authority to punish (114-15). In sum, several of Boonin’s objections to theories are weak because he does not adequately appreciate the limited scope of what the theories are trying to explain. As a result, he often objects to theories because they cannot account for features of the practice of punishment that they were never meant to explain.

Boonin is not the first to defend the possibility of abolishing punishment in favor of pure restitution. See, e.g., Barnett (1979). However, his defense is an important contribution to the literature because he anticipates an extraordinarily wide range of objections to the view and responds to them insightfully. He does, though, miss some important objections. For example, he never mentions the principle against penal substitution (Lewis 128). Insofar as a criminal deserves to be punished, others cannot remove her punitive desert by undergoing a punishment on her behalf. She will deserve to be punished until she suffers a punishment herself. Unlike punitive desert, however, a criminal’s obligation of corrective justice can be fulfilled vicariously by third parties providing the required compensation to her victims on her behalf. Assuming a criminal’s obligation of corrective justice is fulfilled vicariously by third parties, then under a practice of pure restitution, the state could not subject the criminal to any harmful treatment in response to her crime. To many, this will seem an unacceptable implication of the practice. To avoid problems of substitution, the state might require the criminal to provide the compensation without any assistance from others. It would do so, however, at the expense of turning the practice of pure restitution into a practice of punitive restitution, which would be a punishment. In requiring the criminal to provide the compensation without help from others, the state would seem to intend that the process of her providing the compensation be harmful to her.

Although Boonin insightfully responds to many objections to pure restitution, some of his responses are problematic. Consider this failed-attempts objection (249-55). Suppose a misanthrope tries to kill someone. He loads a gun, aims it at a person, and pulls the trigger. The gun misfires, however, because the bullet was defective. On the face of it, since his intended victim was not directly harmed, the misanthrope does not seem to owe her any compensation. So it might seem that under a practice of pure restitution, the state could not subject the misanthrope to any harmful treatment in response to his attempt. This implication will strike many as too lenient. After all, those who commit failed-attempts at serious crimes are thought to deserve quite severe punishments.

As an initial response, Boonin points out that if the intended victim or others discover a failed-attempt, it will indirectly harm them in various ways (250-51). In particular, others will incur certain costs of insecurity in response to the criminal who committed the attempt. They will fear him more. They will avoid valuable activities that would leave them too vulnerable to him. Additionally, they will invest more in services aimed at protecting them from him. Assuming failed-attempts cause others to incur the costs of insecurity, then those who commit the attempts will owe others compensation for such costs, and providing the compensation might be burdensome.

Ultimately, Boonin finds this initial response inadequate because it presupposes that others discover failed-attempts (250-51). It does not explain why those who commit failed-attempts owe anyone any compensation if the attempts go undiscovered. Hence he offers a risk-based response that might provide such an explanation. This response rests on three assumptions. First, if an act subjects someone to a higher probability of suffering significant harm, then the act makes her worse off (251). Second, if an act makes someone worse off, it harms her (252). Third, failed-attempts at serious crimes subject their intended victims to a higher probability of suffering significant harm (252). Hence, even if a failed-attempt goes undiscovered, it still harms the intended victim, and compensation is owed for such harm.

Boonin’s analysis of the failed-attempts objection is problematic for several reasons. At the outset, his reason for rejecting the initial response is puzzling. It is true that others will incur the costs of insecurity in response to a failed-attempt only if they discover it. Nevertheless, in defending a practice of pure restitution against the failed-attempts objection, the challenge is to explain why the state would be justified in responding to attempts by requiring those who commit them to compensate someone for some harm. To respond to a failed-attempt, the state must discover it. Moreover, the state has a duty to publicize the crimes it discovers, including failed-attempts. Because a defense of the practice of pure restitution should presuppose that the failed-attempts at issue are discovered, the possibility that some will go undiscovered is not a good reason to find the initial response inadequate.

Boonin’s risk-based response is also puzzling. He contends that a failed-attempt harms the intended victim because it raises the probability she will suffer harm. This claim is questionable for many reasons. For example, it is not clear whether Boonin is talking about objective or subjective probabilities, and either way the claim seems contestable. On the one hand, suppose he is talking about objective probabilities. Then it is not clear why failed-attempts raise the probability of harm to the intended victim. Given the defective bullet in the misanthrope case, the objective probability of the attempt’s succeeding was presumably zero. On the other hand, suppose Boonin is talking about subjective probabilities. Then we need to know the perspective from which to determine the probability. It is not clear, however, what perspective Boonin has in mind or what perspective would vindicate his claim.

On the face of it, there are only three possibilities worth considering. First, the relevant perspective might be that of the criminal who commits the failed-attempt. However, Boonin rejects this possibility. Suppose someone attempts to commit a murder by using a gun that, unknown to him, turns out to be empty or a toy. Although the criminal’s subjective probability that his attempt will be successful might be high, Boonin contends that such an attempt would pose no risk to the intended victim (253). Second, the relevant perspective might be that of others, such as the intended victim. However, Boonin also rejects this possibility since he is specifically concerned with undiscovered attempts. If an attempt goes undiscovered, then it will not raise others’ subjective probability that the attempt will harm anyone. Third, the relevant perspective might be that of a hypothetical observer. To make sense of this possibility, we need to know what the observer is supposed to believe with what credence, and Boonin does not say. If the observer were to believe all the facts with certainty, then her ex ante subjective probability that any failed-attempt will succeed would presumably be zero.

Even if Boonin could clarify his claims about probability, it is still not clear that a mere higher probability of suffering significant harm itself makes someone worse off. Other things being equal, people are warranted in preferring to minimize risks. Risks can have bad effects. Nevertheless it is contestable whether a mere risk of harm is itself a harm.

In the final analysis, Boonin provides an extraordinarily comprehensive critique of a wide range of theories about why the practice of punishment might be morally permissible. For this reason alone, the book would make an important contribution to any advanced undergraduate or graduate course on the subject. In addition, Boonin provocatively calls into question the ultimate need for punishment by insightfully defending an alternative practice of pure restitution from numerous objections. Whether or not one agrees with his defense of abolitionism, Boonin convincingly shows that a plausible solution to the problem of punishment will look very different from any theory that has come before in the literature.


Barnett, Randy E. “Restitution: A New Paradigm of Criminal Justice.” Ethics 87 (1977): 279-301.

Garcia, J. L. A. “Two Concepts of Desert.” Law and Philosophy 5 (1986): 219-235.

Hampton, Jean. “Correcting Harms Versus Righting Wrongs: The Goal of Retribution.” UCLA Law Review 39 (1992): 1659-702.

Husak, Douglas N. “Why Punish the Deserving?” Noûs 26 (1992): 447-64.

Lewis, David. “Do We Believe in Penal Substitution?” Papers in Ethics and Social Philosophy. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2000. 128-35.

Rawls, John. “Two Concepts of Rules.” Philosophical Review 64 (1955): 3-32.