The Problem of Relativism in the Sociology of (Scientific) Knowledge

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Richard Schantz and Markus Seidel (eds.), The Problem of Relativism in the Sociology of (Scientific) Knowledge, Ontos, 2012, 235pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381283.

Reviewed by João Arriscado Nunes, University of Coimbra, Portugal


This volume brings together the contributions to an international conference held at Siegen (Germany) in March 2011 and organized by the University of Siegen and the Center for Philosophy of Science of the University of Münster. With two exceptions (Barry Barnes and Harvey Siegel) the contributors work at German universities and their disciplinary affiliation is either philosophy or sociology.

Major topics covered include naturalism as an inspiration for 'Edinburgh relativism' (Barry Barnes); the incoherence of relativistic research programs, based on the example of the Edinburgh Strong Programme (Harvey Siegel); anti-realism as a necessary condition of relativism, the inconsistency of relativism as characterized by faultless disagreement, and the concept of truth held by truth relativism (Richard Schantz); the question of the theory-ladenness of perception and whether it can lead to epistemic relativism (Madalena Eckes, Simon Erll, André Wenclawiak); the extent and nature of the link between social constructivism/constructionism and relativism (Maria Baghramian); the relation between relativism and the new sociology of knowledge at the roots of social constructivism in the 1960s, and the key role of phenomenology, experience and the life-world at the origin of the latter (Hubert Knoblauch); Mannheim's approach to reflexive relationism and the historicity of knowledge (Martin Endress); Mannheim's exemption of the content of mathematics and the natural sciences from sociological investigations (Markus Seidel); and Michael Polanyi's theory of knowledge and the question of relativism (Eva-Maria Jung).

It would be misleading (as happened with this reader) to approach this volume as a debate on relativism in Edinburgh-style sociology of scientific knowledge (SSK), as the title might suggest (more on the parentheses around "scientific" later). The contributors offer challenging discussions of Mannheim, Kuhn, Hanson, Michael Polanyi, McDowell, Husserl, Schutz or Quine, among others. Plato and his early engagements with the sophists have a place as well. Interestingly (even though Quine or Davidson may be regarded as part of the "family", and Rorty is briefly mentioned as holding relativistic positions), a discussion of pragmatist philosophy -- a major influence on some influential sociological approaches to science and scientific knowledge -- is missing. Another conspicuous absence is Ludwik Fleck, the "retrospective precursor" of science studies and a focus of a growing scholarly corpus, whose work has opened up research directions beyond the relativism-realism debate.

The title of the volume, where "Scientific" appears in parentheses, already hints at two possible ways of approaching the various contributions: either as an engagement with relativism as a central epistemological commitment of SSK, or as a collection of diverse philosophical and sociological approaches to relativism and (scientific) knowledge. Limitations of space preclude a detailed discussion of all the contributions. As a sociologist and science studies scholar, I was particularly interested in the way the volume and the individual essays relate to the developments and debates within science studies over the last three decades.

Having closely followed -- and participated in -- some of the intellectual struggles associated with the so-called Science Wars of the mid- and late 1990s, I was curious about the current state of a discussion which, at the time, seemed to be a major source of fierce debates over the objective and rational status of scientific knowledge. Those familiar with recent directions research within the heterogeneous field of science studies has taken may feel that the debate over relativism has been safely parked in the past. The debate was central, to be sure, to the early challenges of the emerging sociology of scientific knowledge (SSK), from the early 1970s on, to both Mertonian sociology of science and Mannheimian sociology of knowledge. SSK had different incarnations: the Strong Programme (aka the Edinburgh School) and the Empirical Programme of Relativism (EPOR), championed, respectively, by Barry Barnes and David Bloor and by Harry Collins.

These early approaches were challenged, in turn, from other directions built on criticisms of the Strong Programme and of EPOR. Actor-network theory (ANT), associated with Michel Callon, Bruno Latour and John Law, among others, was particularly successful in taking up the legacy of SSK and leading it in new directions with new concerns. In the process, the discussion of relativism took up issues of ontologies (historical and mobile), performativity, practices, normativity and politics, among other topics. Prominent figures in these new debates include, besides Callon, Latour, and Law, Annemarie Mol, Susan Leigh Star, Donna Haraway, Andrew Pickering, Karen Barad and a host of other scholars from a range of disciplinary backgrounds, moving across a landscape of positions flagged by feminism, pragmatism, and different brands of realism -- pragmatic, agential or speculative, to name only some of the most prominent ones -- and reaching into postcolonial and decolonial studies. The apparent loss of centrality of the relativism debate should not, however, lead to the conclusion that the debates over relativism have just been replaced by new fads and fashions of intellectual debate, as the editors rightly argue in their introduction to the volume (p.15, n. 18).

I found the opening chapter by Barry Barnes particularly interesting, perhaps the pivotal essay in the book, despite the lack of any consistent engagement with it by other contributors. Whereas most of the authors are explicit about their critical stance towards different versions of relativism, Barnes is unapologetic about his endorsement of a version of relativism as central to the conception of scientific knowledge held by the Edinburgh Strong Programmers. He goes further, however, by adding two moves to that endorsement. The first is an account of Strong Programme relativism as a practical, rather than a doctrinal issue. This allows him to elaborate on relativism as constitutive of the very practices of producing scientific knowledge and of the sociology of scientific knowledge itself. The second move consists of mobilizing the legacy of the Strong Programme version of SSK in an account of the epistemological underpinnings of current work in science studies, affiliated or not with the Strong Programme.

The chapter provides what could be described as an introduction to the theme of the book from the side of SSK, which the reader would expect to be complemented by critical engagements, philosophical and sociological, by other authors. Barnes sets out to discuss relativism not as a set of statements bound to a doctrinal set of principles, but as a resource for handling practical problems of knowing (describing and classifying phenomena or objects). He begins by insisting that "there are many forms of relativism and some of them involve a positive view of the natural sciences and may even be presented as expressions of a scientific orientation", adding that a "high regard for science may not merely be consistent with relativism but the inspiration for it" (p. 23).

He summarizes the main features of SSK as the acknowledgment -- influenced by a reading of Thomas Kuhn's The Structure of Scientific Revolutions - that knowledge, including scientific knowledge, is the possession of collectives and part of the shared cultural tradition of these collectives. The distribution and use of knowledge within collectives is socially structured, and its use and application is socially contingent (pp. 24-25). Interestingly, Barnes regards work such as that of historian of science Robert Kohler, on experimental systems using Drosophila as a model organism, as exemplary of how to extend his own finitist views. These extended views rely on accounts of the material assemblages of scientific work -- practice, instruments, experimental settings -- and its moral economies. Discussions of Dawkins's and Sokal's (p. 34, especially n.12) dismissal of relativism seeks to illustrate, in contrast to what Barnes calls the "antediluvian view of the science-technology relationship" held by Dawkins in the mid-1990s, how the version of relativism held by Strong Programmers provides an effective tool for the exploration of alternative paths in scientific and technological practice, which take seriously historical and social contingency. Barnes insists that the use, by sociologists of scientific knowledge, of the resources offered by relativism does not require a systematic, doctrinal approach, which aims at dissecting its principles. It requires instead the appropriation of those resources as tools for the practice of empirically-based research practice. Even for many sociologists and historians of science who do not endorse all the positions advocated by the Strong Programme, Barnes's exposé strikes a chord when he moves towards accounts of research centered on the material assemblages and practices through which scientific and technological objects are produced, appropriated and manipulated.

It might be expected that the following chapter, by Harvey Siegel, would offer a critical engagement with Barnes's contribution. Instead, however, we find one more rehearsal of the principles of the Strong Programme as they were stated by Barnes and Bloor in the early 1980s. Siegel's discussion seems to rest upon the strong assumption that what Joseph Rouse (inspired by Foucault ) called epistemic sovereignty is located in epistemology, that is, in the claim of epistemology to legislate what counts as knowledge and how to adjudicate knowledge claims. But the question is: why should we prefer the terms of the discussion as they are set by Siegel to those advanced by Barnes in his contribution? Why should the discussion of relativism be framed as a philosophical, rather than sociological, debate? Why should a discussion based on the philosophical critique of the principles of the Strong Programme be preferred to one drawing on the actual exemplars of research inspired by it? This, I believe, may be at the root of some of the misunderstandings which this volume, despite the quality of the contributions it gathers, is likely to generate among readers engaged in science studies.

Even Maria Baghramian's chapter, the only one in the book that explicitly takes up more recent developments in science studies (for example, those associated with Bruno Latour's work), ends up reasserting arguments against both relativism as an "unsustainable philosophical position" and what she calls the "absurdities of radical constructionism". She charges both approaches with the "negation of objective and universal standards and norms for establishing the truth, rationality and reasonableness of scientific claims", a "denial of reason" which is "a consequence of relativism", even if it should not be "equated with it" (p. 127). One could draw on Barnes's arguments to question whether the call for universal standards and norms for assessing the truth, rationality and reasonableness of scientific claims stands the test of decades of historical, sociological and anthropological research on the production of science and technology. Her closing reference to what she describes as a "recantment" by Latour of his earlier, objectionable constructionist views (pp. 175-6) stands on an elided version of a long and winding history. This history details how objectivity, rationality, reasonableness and truth themselves became research topics, the subject of ethnographic and historical approaches to scientific practices and scientific objects, showing how they were the outcome of situated processes (this includes Latour's own oeuvre). It would be an interesting exercise, of course, to further explore extensions of this kind of approach to the relations between science studies and its philosophical critiques, their entanglements and tensions, a path which has been opened up by the work of Rouse, among others.

Those who, like this reader, expected this volume to be more centered on SSK and its science studies progeny than it is may feel disappointed, especially after failing to find responses to the main issues raised by Barry Barnes in his contribution. But this is not a reason to set the book aside. The critical tone of my comments means neither an unconditional endorsement of the Strong Programme nor a lack of appreciation of these finely crafted and intellectually challenging essays. I would certainly recommend this collection as a significant, even if partial, contribution to philosophical, sociological and historical debates on relativism and knowledge.