The Problem of Universals in Early Modern Philosophy

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Stefano Di Bella and Tad M. Schmaltz (eds.), The Problem of Universals in Early Modern Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2017, 352pp., $99.00, ISBN 9780190608040.

Reviewed by Benjamin Hill, Western University


There was a time, not long ago, when no one would have dared publish a book on early modern treatments of the problem of universals. "The early moderns never considered the problem of universals! They were epistemologists, not metaphysicians. They were the ones who rid philosophy of extravagancies and pseudo-problems such as universals. Hume, remember, nicely expressed their hostility toward such abstruse things: 'When we run over libraries, persuaded of these principles, what havoc must we make? If we take in our hand any volume; of divinity or school metaphysics, for instance; let us ask, Does it contain any abstract reasoning concerning quantity or number? No. Does it contain any experimental reasoning concerning matter of fact and existence? No. Commit it then to the flames: For it can contain nothing but sophistry and illusion.'"[1]

Thankfully, we are moving past such attitudes, and the result has been a far more complicated, and more interesting, perception of their philosophical activities. This collection is a fine contribution to this new view of the early moderns, one which enrichens our understanding of their deeper commitments and attitudes. No self-respecting academic library should be without this title, and no historian of early modern philosophy should be ignorant of it.

Of course, as an edited volume, it exhibits the usual range of advantages and disadvantages endemic to the genre -- some hits and some misses; some technical, analytic slogs and some contextually-oriented surveys; and some groundbreaking ideas and suggestions alongside some rehashing of old ideas and old debates. But it also exhibits some problems unique to it. The first is the title itself, which is somewhat misleading. If one were to focus on the "The" in the title, she might think it adopts a Lovejoy-like fixation on tracing out the life and reception of Plato's original problem of The-One-Over-the-Many across the Seventeenth and Eighteenth centuries. That's not the case, however (and anyone familiar with the editors' own works would know not to expect something like that). More likely -- and more problematically -- readers might latch onto the "Problem" in the title and think that the topic of universals had become problematized for the early moderns. In particular, problematized in a way similar to how the problem of consciousness has become problematized for us or the problem of The-One-Over-the-Many for Plato and Aristotle or the epistemic and semantic problems of universal cognition for the medievals. Such a thought would not be correct, either. Universals were not a focal point in philosophical research and reflection during the early modern period, and the problem of universals neither set the tone or agenda for philosophical investigations nor animated philosophical debates and developments. In an important sense, there really was no problem of universals among the early moderns. However, almost every early modern philosopher had something to say about universals -- or, more precisely, about universal cognition -- as it arose and was affected by the pursuit of their primary philosophical concerns. The editors seem to recognize this difference (1), even if not every contributor seems to. But readers might nevertheless wish that the editors were clearer and more forthright in considering how this feature of the early modern approach toward universals might affect our understandings of their comments on universals.

A second problem concerns the lack of balance in the volume. It is skewed in a few ways. Although it ranges from 1624-1787, it leans heavily on the seventeenth century. Ten of the thirteen chapters are devoted to thinkers between Gassendi and Locke/Leibniz. Only three cover the eighteenth century. One of the merits of the volume is that it ventures beyond the usual canonical figures (although it includes no women, no Anne Conway on species, for example). Gassendi is here, as are the "minor" Cartesians (Arnauld, Regis, and Desgabet), and the English "Platonists" (More, R. Cudworth, and Norris); they all receive substantial, individual treatments and even figures like Mario Nizolius and Francisco Suárez pop up as more than just names in several essays. Yet this is exclusively in the seventeenth-century material; in the eighteenth-century material, the only philosopher other than Berkeley, Hume, and Kant to appear is (surprise, surprise) Locke, and then he is always as the set up for the reflections of the others.

This imbalance is probably directly related to the final imbalance I'd like to note, a methodological imbalance. There are no contextualist or contextualizing approaches represented in the eighteenth-century material; all three of those chapters (as well as the two on Locke) are traditionally analytic, i.e., narrow philosophical analyses of the usual textual material. There's nothing wrong with that, and these chapters are all very good exemplars of the approach. But (and this is my point) there are only such treatments of the eighteenth-century material, unlike the two or three contextualist treatments of universality among the Cartesians, the English Platonists, and Leibniz. One, or even two, contextualist chapters on the Scottish Enlightenment or post-Leibnizian German metaphysics would have evened things out quite a bit, had the editors chose to include them.[2]

A final problem arises concerning the use of the term "Platonism" (or "Theological Platonism"). It too is somewhat misleading. I think that everyone, when prompted, would acknowledge that what is meant is some form of Augustinianism rather than Platonism as such. But why not, in at least some cases, some form of Fician neo-Platonism? The differences between Platonism (as we conceive it now), seventeenth-century Augustinianism, and Fician neo-Platonism are certainly subtle, but they are by no means insignificant, especially for a topic that, like universals, intersects with so many other themes. What's at stake is not simply the postulation of a "Third Realm" or the ontic status of universals. It's their connections with the Divine Will, the nature of Divine cognition and God's Intellect, and the type(s) of Being attributed to them that are also directly affected by the differences between the views the labels refer to-- and all three of these are common themes across many of the essays. With the exception of the essays by Tad Schmaltz, Brunello Lotti, and Stefano Di Bella, there does not appear to be much sensitivity to what is being elided or obscured by the term "Platonism". Perhaps it is unfair to lay this at the editors' feet, especially when they themselves recognize some of the nuance underlying the term (5-6); this just might a typical aspect of historical scholarship. But readers should be on guard against it. Moreover, it could have been a way for the editors to advance the discussions of this issue and perhaps even historical scholarship itself.

The editorial introduction is a bit thin for the likely readers (historians of early modern philosophy). The depictions of the ancient and medieval backgrounds, the modern turn, and modern issues concerned with classification and science are meager, and the overviews of each essay, standard. Historians of early modern philosophy might gain more from the presentations of the conceptual apparatuses of the late medieval via moderna in Joël Biard's contribution to The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy or Gyula Klima's SEP entry.[3]

There are some gems among the essays. Antonia LoLordo offers one of the few extensive treatments of Gassendi on universals. Nominalism seems to have been an assumed starting position for Gassendi, Lolordo suggests, and much of his attention was on the nature of universals as ideas -- were they abstract idea, aggregate ideas, or both? LoLordo explores the development of Gassendi's thought in this regard and attempts to clean up the tensions between an aggregate and an abstractive conception by suggesting that they are, in some way not entirely clear, both.

Samuel Newlands provides a refreshingly clear analysis and reconstruction of Spinoza's conception of universals as entia rationis. Spinoza's focus was on the psychological processes implicated by the formation of these concepts and their dangers for us. Newlands explores how far a conceptualist such as Spinoza could reconcile and defend accounts of real attributes and abstracted common notions with his "more deflationary and radical" conceptualism (65). The adequacy of Newlands' suggestions is not altogether clear to me, but perhaps Spinoza scholars will better appreciate their significance and novelty.

I found Tad Schmaltz's use of the ambiguities underlying Descartes' conceptualist statements very interesting. In keeping with his recent book Early Modern Cartesianisms: Dutch and French Constructions, Schmaltz leverages the ambiguities within Descartes' writings into rich comparisons of the "Platonic" Cartesianism of Malebranche, the "conceptualist" Cartesianism of Arnauld, and the "non-Platonic, non-conceptualist" Cartesianism of the radicals Regis and Desgabet, which rests on the "indefectibility" of substance (136) as the basis for the eternality of the Cartesian eternal truths. Not only does Schmaltz have illuminating things to say about the Cartesians, his analysis of the real ambiguities inherent to Descartes' own conceptions provides a powerful interpretation of Descartes' own thinking.

Brunello Lotti's discussion of conceptualism among the English "Platonists" (More, R. Cudworth, and Norris) was, to my mind, one of the more significant contributions. The idea of self-avowed Platonists resolutely adopting a rigorous form of conceptualism was revelatory, driving home the fact that the consequentialist trend was, for some reason, deeply entrenched within the early modern mindset and cut across many of the (to us) usual divisions among thinkers. I also found Lotti's distinction between epistemological and metaphysical conceptualisms interesting and helpful too, not only when directed at the figures Lotti examined, but also at figures found throughout the volume.

Many of the more "analytic" essays in the volume failed to resonate much with me, I'm sorry to report. I'm not quite sure why. In a couple of cases, I, as a historian, had no real professional interest in the authors' projects. I feel pretty indifferent toward comparisons of Malebranche's doctrine of ideas with Aquinas' account of the Beatific vision and the Divine Ideas (although I might feel differently toward comparisons with seventeenth-century Jesuits or sixteenth-century Dominicans), and I feel pretty indifferent toward partial defenses of Locke's semantics of natural-kind terms from Kripke-Putnam style critiques. In other cases, it feels like there are only so many times we can plow through the same primary texts in the same basic sort of way and turn up something new, thoughtful, or interesting to say about them. And in others, it feels as if inadequate attention is being paid to the progress earlier essays were making, such that the same questions that were previously answered are being naively raised again or that we are just laboriously spinning through the ruts made when the same ground was previously covered. The three essays that seemed more interesting to me, however, were: Lawrence Nolan's update to his argument for a conceptualist interpretation of Descartes, which rests on the simplicity of substance for Descartes; Tom Stoneham's account of Berkeley's semiotic solution to the epistemic problem of universal cognition; and finally, Donald Baxter's comparison of Hume's critique of abstractionism with his problem of identity and the parallels between them. For individuals specifically interested in those thinkers and topics, I recommend these essays.

The very best edited volumes are like well-crafted photo-mosaics -- they provide a fruitfully interesting and, ideally, provocative perspective on the whole period, a perspective that emerges not only from the arrangement and internal characteristics of the individual chapters, but also from the contrasts and interplay among those internal characteristics, as highlighted by the editor's introduction. This book seems to me to represent a bit of a missed opportunity in this regard. One of the things that is quite striking when you read the chapters and review the primary literature they marshal from this angle is that the early moderns' focus is almost universally on the epistemic and semantic problem of universals, and not at all on the ontological one. Another striking feature is that they were all committed to ontological particularism. And a third is that they are all, even Suárez, developing some form of conceptualism, even the self-avowed "Platonists" among them.

To my eyes, this is all suggestive of the late medieval via moderna and the thought that the via moderna continued into the era as a conceptual hegemony whose constitutive ideas and distinctions survive the translations into different philosophical idioms and across different philosophical orientations and contexts. In itself, this would be interesting: Gyula Klima suggested that the conceptual frameworks of both the via antiqua and the via moderna collapsed and disappeared around this time since neither could defeat the other, but perhaps the via moderna instead lived on in Northern Europe under new and assumed names. We might wish for rich and robust scholarship tracing out the legacies of Jean Buridan, Jean Maior, and the Wittenbergians with regard to the via moderna to help us to understand the early moderns' conceptualism, ontological particularism, and their focus on the semantics of universal cognition.

It would have been nice to see the editors or authors suggesting something like this. But I think there's potentially more here too. It might be fruitful to see the early moderns' discussions as revolving around the ways of addressing questions about the universalia ante rem within the conceptual framework of the via moderna and whether (or not) universals so conceived can , or must provide grounds for the semantics of universal cognition, either human or divine. The centrality of concerns with the eternal truths and the divine ideas as well as the conceptualism of the self-avowed "Platonists" make more sense, it seems to me, when thought of in terms of incorporating and using the category of universalia ante rem as a constituent in that broadly Ockhamistic conceptual framework. It is not obvious, for example, how to square an extensional semantics with an intellectualist account of God and Creation or the eternality of eternal truths. A couple of contributions are, I think, pulling in this direction (Lotti's and Di Bella's), but I would have liked to have seen the editors push readers harder in this direction and to have explored further the parallels between the semantics (and epistemology) of the via moderna and early modern conceptualism. Instead, the editors offer the usual dynamic of the breakdown of Aristotelian science (and the realist assumptions supporting it) by the new mechanistic science as the driver for early modern reflection on universals (3-4 and 7-9).[4] A missed opportunity, as I said above, to point our scholarly conversation about universals in the early modern period in an interesting, new direction, it seems to me.

While I cannot recommend that historians add this text to their private collections, they will want to ensure that their university's library has a copy for them to consult and review as their own research dictates. Historians particularly interested in cognition or ontology in the early modern period will want to pay closer attention to it, especially the material covering the seventeenth century.

[1] The Hume quote in the imagined dialogue is, of course, the final paragraph of An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, ed. Tom Beauchamp, The Clarendon Edition of the Works of David Hume, (Oxford University Press, 2000), 123.

[2] Even if you want to rank Locke and Leibniz as transitional figures, the balance is still a bit off -- seven chapters for seventeenth-century figures (Gassendi-Norris); three chapters, for Locke and Leibniz (1690s through about 1705); three chapters for Berkeley, Hume, and Kant (1710-1787). This lack of balance is not reflective of the philosophical material available: Hutcheson, Reid, Wolff, and Baumgarten immediately spring to mind as authors of influential volumes of metaphysics in the eighteenth century.

[3] Joël Biard, "Nominalism in the Later Middle Ages," The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy, ed. Robert Pasnau with Christina van Dyke, 2nd edition (Cambridge University Press, 2014), 661-673; Gyula Klima, s.v. "The Medieval Problem of Universals," Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 31 October 2017.

[4] See Martha Brandt Bolton, "Universals, Essences, and Abstract Entities," in The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, eds. Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers (Cambridge University Press, 2000), 178-211.