The Problem with Levinas

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Simon Critchley, The Problem with Levinas, Alexis Dianda (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2015, 156pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198738763.

Reviewed by James Hatley, Salisbury University


Starting with its title, Simon Critchley's book, an edited transcript of four lectures presented to students in a summer course in the Netherlands in 2013, is doubly provocative. His goal is to set out what he has come to understand anew as the "problem that Levinas' work was trying to pose" (v), as well as Critchley's own "problem" with Levinas' answer. In doing so, Critchley would interrupt business as usual in what at one point he characterizes as the reduction of Levinas' work "to a series of slogans about 'the ethics of alterity,' 'the Other' (capital O), and so on" (133) that parrot the latter's discourse without actually attending carefully to the philosophic context in which his thought emerges and the specific interlocutors to whom it is addressed. Here Critchley's approach is reminiscent of the opening chapters of Diane Perpich's The Ethics of Emmanuel Levinas. But even more provocatively, he would alter the direction Levinas' work takes when the he moves from a discussion of eros and fecundity at the end of Totality and Infinity to recasting his work in terms of substitution, recurrence and fraternity in Otherwise than Being. In doing so, Critchley would resist readings of Levinas that envision his project as one primarily attuned to "a broadly liberal world view," to focus instead on "a less familiar -- and perhaps more troubling -- picture of Levinas' work," but one that would be "truer to what Levinas actually thought" (133).

In his opening lecture, Critchley poses the question of what method is called for in reading Levinas, who has a well-deserved reputation for being challenging in this regard. Levinas is most often understood as engaged in a reworking of the phenomenological method to address "the deep structures of experience" (8). But complicating this judgment is Levinas' own insistence that his philosophic project functions as a translation of Hebraic experience into Greek terms, such that "the eschatology of messianic peace will have come to superpose itself upon the ontology of war" (8). In spite of this, Critchley distances himself throughout these lectures from readings that explicitly turn to Levinas' Hebraic sources or confessional essays. Instead he characterizes Levinas as possessing a "religious intuition" (8) -- the reference remains intentionally vague -- that is to be submitted straightforwardly to philosophic interpretation. Critchley also draws attention to a series of passages from Levinas' writings that hint at how the latter understands his reworking or torsion of the phenomenological method as being engaged in a mode of drama, much as it is formulated by Nietzsche rather than Aristotle. Taking his cue here, Critchley proposes reading Levinas as engaged in the performance of a "holy story" or "event" (10) in the Nietzschean sense, characterized by "displacement" and "the enactment, the literal enactment, of ambiguity, of moral ambiguity" (13).

Having determined to read Levinas' work as drama, Critchley claims he is now in the position to identify and address what is Levinas' "fundamental problem" (13). The choice of that latter word, which at times is replaced by "question" in Critchley's text, is curious and introduced without much if any explanation. Generally the writer of this review shies away from characterizing philosophical questions as problems, which is to say, a state of affairs that is unwanted and that in turn is to be resolved through one's all-too-human ingenuity. Put otherwise, one lives in questions but solves problems, and philosophy is better off engaged in the former. On the other hand, 'problem' is over-determined in its meaning for Critchley, since its deployment here also witnesses a struggle, even conflict, that he is engaged in -- he has problems both with Levinas and with the readers of Levinas. And also, it turns out, with himself. As he points out to his students,

the correct philosophical attitude is to be at war with yourself . . . If you know what you think, then it's just going to be boring. You have to begin from the idea that you don't know but you think, and that what you think is probably conflicted at some deep level. Writing is a way of staging that and maybe working it through (17).

In this vein, Critchley traces out the problem Levinas has with Heidegger, which is as well the problem Levinas is characterized as having with himself. Like Heidegger, Levinas understands ontology as a "practical, finally embodied, affective process," one that is opposed to "classical intellectualism" (9) but more importantly also recognizes the inclination to philosophy as inextricably interwoven with the living of one's life in its concreteness. As Critchley puts it, "To think is no longer to contemplate but to commit oneself, to be engulfed by that which one thinks, to be involved" (20). For Heidegger, Bewandtnis, involvement, proves to be the key structure disclosing the meaning of Being-in-the-world, a dramatic turn to our existence that is comedic in its arrival but ultimately tragic in its outcome, as we find ourselves "responsible beyond our intentions" (20). Unintended consequences first surprise and upend our assumed mastery of the world, only to end up riveting us to it. The drama here is one of complicity without exit, such that "the awkwardness of the act turns against the goal pursued" and becomes, as Levinas himself names it, "tragedy." (20).

Levinas' problem, Critchley concludes, is relatively straightforward: how to escape the tragedy of finitude. And to respond to this problem, one must in turn specify this flight as being from the tragic structures of factiticity and enworldment advanced by Heideggerian ontology, a mode of involvement that one cannot evade simply by returning to the "classical disengaged notion of the subject" (26). Another way Critchley's approach might be characterized is that Levinas seeks to rewrite the tragic drama of Heidegger by changing the timing, by averting the threat of finitude through affirming infinitude in one manner or another without at the same time resorting to the philosophical equivalent of a deus ex machina. What is not so straightforward is how this evasion might be accomplished.

In his second lecture Critchley complicates this picture further by introducing Levinas' account in 1934 of a mode of thinking identified as "Hitlerism." In it one celebrates rather than is shamed or horrified by Heideggerian facticity, of one's being riveted to one's being in the world. Hitlerism in effect embraces the very tragedy that Levinas (and Critchley) would have us escape. Further, Levinas argues here that the politics of National Socialism are not a historical anomaly but the order of things as they emerge in the collapse/failure/anemia of enlightenment liberalism, as well as its wayward child, Marxism. Critchley emphasizes that the importance of this assessment of the ontological roots of National Socialism, which too often is read as a footnote to Levinas' project, cannot be neglected. Several points made here deserve mentioning.: 1) the source of Hitlerism "stems from the essential possibility of elemental Evil" (32); 2) National Socialism produces a form of universalism that is bio-political; 3) this account of the universal is a direct assault upon Judaism, Christianity, and liberalism, all of which in one manner or another defend "the idea of freedom from the limitations of historical existence" (35).

In his discussion of these matters, Critchley intervenes increasingly in his own voice to take issue in part with Levinas and in part with those who would read Levinas as recommending liberalism. This occurs, among others, in digressions on the political significance of the existence of Israel and the historical greatness -- loaded with irony -- of Europe. Particularly trenchant in regard to the latter issue is Critchley's reflections on why it is no accident that Europe, inspired by liberal ideals affirming the dignity of human autonomy, resorts to violence and conquest in order to spread its values. Here he shows circumspection about Levinas' euro-centrism that fits well with an important ongoing discussion started by, among others, the work of John Drabinsky. But deeply troubling, at least to this reader, is how Critchley also calls out Israel as "the best contemporary bio-political expression of the philosophy of Hitlerism," even as he notes "Jews should be the last people to give credence to the category of race" (38). Here perhaps is the moment to register, if only briefly, a consternation, indeed, problem, with Critchley's clumsiness in regard to decorum, to finding the discerning tone sensitive to how others will hear him, which is to say, in exercising etiquette. Drama is as much a matter of tone and the timing of one's remarks as it is of conceptual acuity, and Critchley does not always do well in regard to the former, even as he is a master of the latter. One of the stranger instances in this regard occurs in a long aside addressing how life in the camps during Nazi occupation turned out to be a great opportunity for French intellectuals to engage in the life of the mind and how badly a certain French philosopher smelled as he recounted his own experience of internment to Critchley. At moments like these, Critchley is very close to becoming, at least briefly, the failed Andy Kauffman of Levinas Studies. In an "Afterward," he apologizes for the clumsiness of his buffoonery (139), but one wonders whether a more judicious or artful editing of his remarks, as they moved from one mode of saying in the intimacy and immediacy of the classroom to another in the more rigorous arena of scholarly publication and public debate, might not have better served to enhance and sharpen the drama of moral ambiguity he is intent upon cultivating here.

Having set out the problematic of escape, Critchley turns to the various ways in which Levinas, as his thinking matures, would find his way beyond tragic finitude, and then, in Critchley's concluding remarks, to how Levinas might be reread with a view to teasing out a better answer implicit but undeveloped in his thought. While Critchley is appreciative of the meta-ethical turn Levinas' work takes as his work matures, particularly in the account, developed in Otherwise than Being, of substitution, of a subject coming to itself through its responsibility for the other, Critchley ultimately concludes this particular instantiation "is just a different description of imprisonment, of captivity, of being held hostage" (135). Particularly unsettling to him, as it has been for a series of Levinas' critics, is the extremity -- allegedly to the point of becoming masochistic -- with which the subject is held responsible for the other, responsible not only for one's own responsibility but also for the other's.

In his final lecture, Critchley returns to Levinas' account of fecundity at the ending of Totality and Infinity, in which the philosopher is marked as male, as being the father of his son. This radical innovation, in which gender intervenes into the more or less genderless and neutral discourse (at least explicitly) of the philosophical tradition, is praised by Critchley even as he finds it deeply problematic. On the positive side, Heideggerian facticity is fatally disrupted by the "comedy of infinitude" (114) characterized in the lapse, "the dead time" (108) between successive generations of one's fecundity. But on the negative side, Levinasian fecundity "misses the possibility that eros might be a relation between equally active but sexually differentiated subjects" (137). Intent on rectifying this omission, Critchley turns to Shir Hashirim, "The Song of Songs," a text Irigaray appeals to in her own critique of Levinasian fecundity. In doing so, Critchley moves beyond Irigaray's at times rather heavy-handed characterization of this work and its relationship to Levinasian fecundity in order to engage in a reading less at odds and more sympathetic with Levinas, or at least with Levinas as Critchley would understand him.

For Critchley, Shir Hashirim is "an ideal topos, even an eu-topos, for an erotics irreducible to either patriarchy or matriarchy" (118). In this regard, he is particularly influenced by how a long line of Christian mystics, especially women but also men, came to interpret this text through their "somatization of religious experience" (123). In this experience, as it is developed by Madame Guyon, for example, God comes to be viewed as "pure and total orality . . . God is the kiss; and the kiss is the passage through which God flows into us in perfect enjoyment" (124). In the enjoyment of this kiss the soul melts away in a manner that is characterized by Simone Weil, the twentieth century mystic, as decreation, which is to say in Critchley's translation of this term, "internal impoverishment" (126). Critchley's discussion leads to this point:

Mysticism is not just a question of the identity of the soul and God . . . It is rather the stranger idea of cultivating poverty in oneself, a decreative process of stripping away that permits the soul to become inhabited by the other. In this way, annihilation would be inhabitation by alterity: the tyranny of egoism gives way to ethical subjectivity (129).

The drama of decreation offers a new and perhaps better way of understanding what might be meant when Levinas, in his characterization of substitution, speaks of "the other within the same" (128).

In his concluding remarks, Critchley opens up the question of how love and desire have become alienated from one another in the contemporary world as "we love in an increasingly ethereal and sentimental way," even as we desire "in an increasingly bio-mechanical and pornographic way" (132). His rereading of Levinas through the lens of Christian mysticism offers a purchase that is promising on these and other issues where the ethical and the erotic are inextricably intertwined. What remains to be seen is precisely how Critchley will make good in the devilish details of a notion of the meta-ethical that is also thoroughly meta-erotic, even as it is messianic.

I conclude by remarking on the peculiar fate the Hebraic elements of Levinas' philosophic discourse suffer under Critchley's approach. Not only Levinas' confessional writings, one of which (the Talmudic essay "Toward the Other") explicitly addresses Heidegger's involvement in National Socialism, are left unexplored, but also the rich texture of Hebraic allusions, sources and concepts in Levinas' philosophic writings are either left unmentioned, or downplayed and marginalized. As a result, the drama (italics mine) involved in Levinas' specifically Hebraic rereading of the philosophical tradition remains for the most part invisible. A striking moment in this regard occurs when Critchley addresses Levinas' hint at the end of Totality and Infinity regarding the "triumph" of messianic time, "where the temporal order is lifted up into the eternal" (109). Is this a new structure of time altogether, Critchley wonders, or simply an intensification of extreme vigilance or insomnia already described by Levinas? This question motivates Critchley's turn to Christian mystical readings of Shir Hashirim discussed above, but only after his first disqualifying Jewish mystical writings, partly because he admits he is not competent in reading them and partly because Scholem has already made it clear that they have been in the whole formulated solely "for men and by men" (120). But precisely a treatment of Jewish mystical thought from the Zohar regarding the promised triumph of messianic time, with a specific reference to how Levinas might be understood in this regard, is to be found in Catherine Chalier's concluding chapter of her Traité des larmes/Treatise on Tears. She recounts there how the Messiah, hidden in the heart of gan eden, cries compassionately yet inconsolably "for the reparation of the dead (tiqqun haMita)" (202/translation mine). I encourage Critchley and his readers to entertain what Chalier's discussion and others like it might contribute to what is otherwise Critchley's remarkable and helpful rereading, or perhaps better put, dramatic rendering of Levinas' philosophical project.