The Procession of the World (De processione mundi)

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Gundissalinus, Dominicus, The Procession of the World (De processione mundi), translated by John A. Laumakis, Marquette University Press, 2002, 100pp, $10.00 (pbk), ISBN 0874622425.

Reviewed by Charles Burnett , Warburg Institute, London


The importance of Dominicus Gundissalinus (or Gundisalvi) in searching out philosophical texts from Arabic and combining them in a fruitful way has been noted by scholars such as Ludwig Baur, Manuel Alonso Alonso, Etienne Gilson, and Jean Jolivet. The original Latin works attributed to him have been edited, but the publication under review is the first attempt, as far as I know, to provide an English translation of any of his works.

Gundissalinus’s style is to juxtapose sets of arguments for a succession of theses. He uses these arguments first to prove that there is a creator (pp. 34-7), that this creator must be the first cause (p. 37), that it must have necessary being (pp. 37-40), and be one (p. 41) and untouched by differences (p. 42), and, finally, that it is God alone (p. 44). He then differentiates between causes (pp. 44-7), and describes the principles of matter and form (pp. 47-62), the motion of creation (p. 62), the elements (pp. 63-4), the first union of matter and form (pp. 64-6), the different kinds of forms (pp. 67-8), corporeal and incorporeal substance (pp. 68-9), the simultaneity of the composition of first matter and form and creation (pp. 71-2), the secondary cause, which is the heavenly bodies, moving the lower bodies of the universe (pp. 72-4), and the third cause, which operates among the lower bodies. He ends with a summary of the process of creation and elemental generation (pp. 74-5), which is then explained in a different way by numerology (pp. 75-6). This piling up of arguments is betrayed by Gundisalvi’s frequent use of the phrases such as ’let us show this in another way’ (pp. 42 and 43), or ’this is also understood in another way’ (p. 54).

This review of the topics shows that the De processione mundi is a work of metaphysics. A large amount of material is taken directly from the metaphysical section (i.e. the beginning) of Hermann of Carinthia’s On the Essences. This fact was unknown to the editor of the Latin text, Georg Bülow, and the parallel passages have helpfully been signalled by Laumakis in the notes. (Unfortunately the extent to which Gundissalinus follows the letter of Hermann’s text is often obscured by Laumakis’s use of the English translation of On the Essences rather than the original Latin, since Laumakis and the translator of Hermann chose different terminology and expressions for the same Latin phrases.) The extent of the borrowing goes even further than Laumakis indicates; e.g. on p. 34, the phrase ’the human mind ascends to the contemplation of God (better translated as ’by contemplation to God’), and the divine goodness descends to man’ corresponds exactly to On the Essences, p. 80, line 12; and on p. 65, the phrase ’form is the ornament … of matter’ corresponds to On the Essences, p. 77, lines 28--9. But Gundissalinus goes beyond Hermann by adding arguments from works that he had translated: the Metaphysics or First Philosophy of Avicenna, the Fons Vitae of Avicebron, and the Liber caeli et mundi of Hunayn ibn Ishaq. Even more significant is the fact that he was apparently indebted to a work that he did not translate: the Exalted Faith of Abraham ibn Daud. This work, written in Toledo in Arabic 1160 or 1168, was never translated into Latin. Either Gundissalinus knew of its contents through direct contact with Ibn Daud (which would lend weight to the identification of Ibn Daud with the Jew ’Avendauth’ who collaborated with Gundissalinus in translating the part Avicenna’s Shifa’ concerning the soul), or Gundissalinus used Arabic texts alongside Latin translations. Both hypotheses are eminently possible.

While Gundissalinus uses a large range of authorities, he never acknowledges his source. His only authorities (aside from the Bible: ’Moses’: p. 63 from Genesis I, 1-2) are the Classical references in his immediate sources: Augustine and Apuleius (p. 69, within a quote from Hermann), and Aristotle (p. 71, most likely from Hunayn ibn Ishaq); the quotation from Plato (p. 63) is too general for its immediate source to be recognized. By omitting mention of his sources he can achieve more of a semblance of a continuous argument, leading inevitably to restating the necessary being of the Christian God.

Laumakis’s translation is sometimes over-literal (e.g. to translate ’autem’ regularly as ’however’ runs the danger of distorting the sequence of thought), but has been carefully done. A great effort has been made, in the notes under the translation, to find all Gundissalinus’s sources, and to show how he used them. Laumakis summarises this information on the sources in the introduction, which also contains a useful account of what we know of Gundissalinus and his writings, the date of composition of the Procession of the World (’no earlier than 1160’), and the structure and content of the work. The introduction ends with an open-ended discussion of the significance of the work and its influence on later scholasticism. Gundissalinus is seen as a pioneer in using philosophical arguments in the service of Christian revelation. Among Laumakis’s secondary works there is good representation of recent works by Spanish authors, but no mention of the discussion concerning Gundissalinus’s identity by Adeline Rucquoi (’Gundisalvus ou Dominicus Gundisalvi’, Bulletin de philosophie médiévale, 41, 1999, pp. 85-106) and Alexander Fidora and María Jesús Soto Bruna (’“Gundisalvus ou Dominicus Gundisalvi”? Algunas observaciones sobre un reciente artículo de Adeline Rucquoi’, Estudios eclesiásticos, 76 [Universidad Pontificia Comillas], 2001, pp. 467-73). It is to be hoped that further translations of the texts of Gundissalinus will follow.