The Promise of Democracy: Political Agency and Transformation

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Fred Dallmayr, The Promise of Democracy: Political Agency and Transformation, SUNY Press, 2010, 254pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438430393.

Reviewed by Sharon Bishop, California State University Los Angeles


Fred Dallmayr's project is to develop theoretic resources adequate to correct minimalist conceptions of democracy that he thinks are undermining political association in our time. He finds help in the work of John Dewey, various strands of postmodernism, and the work of political analysts who are thinking about whether and how Islamic and Asian societies can transform themselves into successful democratic associations. In pursuit of these objectives, he works with highly abstract texts such as those of Hegel, Heidegger and Derrida and in more situationally centered thought.

Dallmayr is alarmed that minimalist and/or liberal conceptions of democracy are driving contemporary Western governments. The difficulty lies in the fact that they either see democracy as a form of government having no particular ethical end at all, or as having a profoundly misguided one. A first group of minimalist conceptions takes democracy to be merely a set of procedures that includes voting rights and institutions to translate votes into legislation. It is clear that no such conception could capture the hopes of historical figures who not only insisted on representation but also wanted room to develop their lives and properties. At best, a procedural conception might work for a political scientist who was centrally interested in how a democratic political system works. A second group of minimalists, liberals and neo-liberals, do better at representing the ends sought by early rebels and theorists, since they focus on freedom and rights. However, the liberty they make central is negative, merely the liberty to be left alone. This trend in political theory became linked with laissez-faire capitalism and its pursuit of individualistic self-interest and corporate profits. The result is a crabbed conception of democracy with inadequate resources for understanding its promise as an ethical association.

The range of Dallmayr's sources is astonishing. There is much to learn from his presentation and discussion of various theorists from the Greeks to the twenty-first century. His subjects include Montesquieu, de Tocqueville, Hegel, Dewey, Heidegger, Derrida, and Gandhi as well as references to many different commentators on contemporary democracy and its potential in Islamic and Asian societies. As it is impossible to do justice to the myriad texts he discusses, I will focus instead on what I believe he takes to be the central contributions from European philosophy.

He begins with the idea that in several respects Hegel can serve as a mentor for recasting democracy. One is Hegel's insistence that society is an association animated by ethical individuals for ethical ends. A second is Hegel's conception of reason. Hegel understands reasoning as an ongoing and unfolding labor rather than a static capacity for grasping concrete wholes. Reason is not merely a theoretical faculty but is tied to practical life in ways that do more than help us discover the means to our ends. It has the power to reconcile us with the world and with others who may be radically different. It can also mediate individual self-will and public unity, and particular interests and public good. The process of reasoned living is difficult. It requires learning and, at the extreme, facing and enduring death. Hegel provides an alternative to democracy as a formal set of procedures that allow individuals to pursue arbitrary personal preferences, and he develops a model of reason that gives it a central role in negotiating the difficulties of living in democratic societies.

While agreeing with several of Hegel's positions, Dallmayr is critical of Hegel's view of reason as absolute spirit that ultimately provides a final end to human history. He reminds us of Adorno's counter that the end of history is an illusion.

In a chapter on Heidegger, Dallmayr favorably quotes him as pressing for a more "originary" position than Hegel provided. It is obvious that "originary" is not thought of as "grounding" some resulting theory; it instead describes a metaphysical and ethical network that creates a space which encourages an open-ended and unfixed search for meaning. The metaphor of a network helps unseat the idea of a "grounding". What seems to make Heidegger's position more "originary" is that he forces us to look at humans as beings who are "thrown into the world", making that part of his theorizing a significant node in the network. In other words, for Heidegger, philosophic (human?) thinking is a practical activity that is liberating and transformative. The contrasting view that thinking is working out the means to our ends misses what Heidegger takes to be the point that action is fulfillment of something present in humans, an unfolding of something into the fullness of its being. And if it is to do that, it requires "care" for what is to unfold and letting it be. These aspects of Heidegger's thought provide a counter-weight to the dominant idea in rational choice theory and many versions of laissez-faire liberal theory that action is pursuit by an agent of a predominantly self-interested goal.

For a view that more fully elaborates Dallmayr's ideas about the ethical and transformative prospects of democracy, he turns to Laclau and Mouffe's Hegemony and Socialist Strategy. He admires their work for grasping the implications of post-structuralism for political life and constructing an "anchorage" to understand specific contemporary social struggles. They are critical of reductionist views that, for example, make the working class central to a theoretical understanding of political life or that predict a revolution that leads to illusory projections of a stable, homogenous future. Their "anchorage" is a non-essentialist conception of hegemony. Like the traditional conception, hegemony as they see it has an impact on personal and political life. But unlike the traditional concept, it is an articulated practice that establishes relations among non-discursively structured differences. In establishing these relations, it changes the character of the elements. Structured totalities of these articulations are called discourses, and positions within discourses are called moments. Discursive positions are formulated by human agents, and they are inevitably in tension with one another. The resulting antagonisms limit what is socially and politically possible. But the negativity of antagonism is, itself, limited by the fact that articulating social formations requires agents to develop positive subject positions. However, no positive formulation can achieve stable hegemony over all others. The resulting picture of democratic societies is one of pluralist struggles over the relations between, for example, liberty and equality, economics and politics. Such struggles take place in a political field that is somewhere between total domination and mutually destructive violence. This makes it a field in which relations can be shifted along moral dimensions. There are no regulative guides for how to negotiate these struggles, nor discussion of how agents can reasonably conduct themselves. At any given moment, it is apparently just a matter of how the balance works out or what particular formulation is functional in a specific situation.

In order to include a moral element in their thinking, Dallmayr tells us, Laclau and Mouffe insert socialist positions into pluralist struggles over equality and liberty. However, Dallmayr offers little or no help about how aspirations to liberty and equality are to be balanced. A concern is that if left to how a given society is functioning, the result could easily be a balance that underestimates equality. Why, for example, might it not happen that the struggle leaves a society with a liberal democracy and a laissez-faire economy? Dallmayr, however, sees their study as at least providing an opening to construct democratic societies as ethical communities that aim to equitably balance liberty and equality.

A chapter on the legacy of Jacques Derrida describes a still more radical break with modern thought. He selects Derrida's "The Ends of Man" to discuss his thoroughgoing rejection of the idea that there is a telos that defines a humanity proper for homo sapiens. Critique of the idea of an end for humankind requires that we place ourselves outside the old terrain and give up the Heideggerian strategy of looking for originary positions. Derrida likens his project to that of Nietzsche's Overman, who burns his text and actively forgets what is behind him.

Of course, any specific attempt to "step outside" requires a terrain to leave, and Derrida has discussed several transgressive moves that achieve a "stepping outside". For Dallmayr, an interesting one is Derrida's notion of disrupting Eurocentrism. Supporters of Eurocentrism claim an identity for Europe as an exemplar of universal ideals or a "heading" for all. Derrida undermines this idea by recasting "headings" as complexes which are always experienced as open possibilities rather than actual "headings" that oppress and constrain. Instead, "headings" should be seen as complexes of possibilities around (a) directions for a person or culture, (b) relations to other headings of different persons and cultures, and (c) to the "other" of the heading. Europe would not, then, close itself off in some exemplary identity, but move toward what it is not, while shifting from what is actual to what is possible. Derrida presents this possibility as an unexpected event to come, as a democracy that has the structure of a promise. It is a promise for an open and perpetually transforming association driven by militant and endless political critique. Derrida sees these critiques as inevitably reaching beyond national borders and creating an "international juridico-political space" which can be seen in struggles over global human rights. Both local and international political spaces are characterized by a distinction between existing laws and "(infinite) justice". Movement is forward from critiqued practices; it is "messianic without messianism". Derrida has come to a complex that (a) says descriptively something is coming, (b) performatively promises something, and (c) transperformatively gestures to positive forward movement.

Dallmayr reacts affirmatively to Derrida's critiques of oppressive practices, emphasis on global human rights, and openness to differences. However, he is doubtful that Derrida has adequate resources to prepare for the radical transformations he expects. For Dallmayr, Derrida's focus is too much on what humans cannot do. Dallmayr works to correct that in a chapter in which he argues for a post-Derridean "other" humanism.

In a chapter titled "Who Are We Now?", he outlines a view that is sensitive to postmodernism's rejection of essentialisms but is more cautiously transgressive than Derrida. He adopts the perspective that there are things proper to humans and societies that are appropriately human. Any of these societies will provide political settings in which members can be and are encouraged to be open to others within their own boundaries and internationally. It is also proper to humans that they be sensitive to nature and to taking care of it. So, at least part of the promise of democratic societies is that they allow and encourage perpetual openness to differences among themselves and between humans and the natural world. Humans, then, are participants in the endless transformation of themselves and their world. Dallmayr sees this transformative process as a "steady quest toward truth and goodness guided by care." (p. 152)

The chapter ends commenting on religious themes that connect the search for truth and goodness with the advent of divine rule and the final, positive meaning of human history. It is uncertain how Dallmayr would distinguish this search from the end of human history that he criticized in Hegel. It is also unclear what this adds to Dallmayr's vision of a properly human society. However, it seems a stretch to suggest that a democracy that is a more or less successful ethical-association answer for whatever human yearnings there are for the meaning of human history. It is difficult enough to understand what would hold together a society marked by perpetual struggles.

The introduction of religious dimensions leads Dallmayr into a general account of relations between democracy and religion and a sharply focused discussion of democratic possibilities in Islamic societies, particularly in Iran. He identifies the domain of religion as what is unconditioned and unconditional and beyond human control. The religious impulse is to connect or reconnect with this divine element. On one hand this connection with what is beyond human control seems available to anyone who makes a distinction between actual laws and a higher law or "infinite justice". That is, it seems a hallmark of the kind of ethics Dallmayr supports that it is always beyond human grasp; it holds out a possibility that is never realized but furthers critiques of actual actions or institutions at any given moment. Such a view of ethics is available to a pluralistic audience, including those who regard themselves as non-religious. Whether Dallmayr would take such an ethical position as falling within the domain of religion, the major point is that anyone with ethical or religious beliefs will want to bring them to political settings.

The difficulty is that in our world there are conflicting and plural views of goodness and justice, and democratic societies are committed to finding a way forward while respecting differences. This alone requires a significant role in democracy for neutrality to religious conviction and for freedom of belief. There are also reasons internal to religion to insist on freedom. Many religions require that conviction be a matter of free commitment and that requires that governments refrain from enforcing religious views and guarantee that citizens are free to practice according to their developed beliefs. This kind of thought leads Dallmayr and others to hold that religions, including Islamic ones, are not only compatible with democracy but require a secular democratic state. A more difficult problem is how secular societies can accommodate religious beliefs about justice and goodness. Since many citizens regard themselves as religiously obligated to various views, they will approach political issues from these views and press for policies that express them. There is little general discussion of how to handle this problem, but Dallmayr does point out that there may be many different democratic ways to approach it. So what we should expect is to find different cultures dealing with it in different ways. What all must have in common though is a commitment to a democratic as opposed to an autocratic government structure, freedom of association and religion, and respect for differences. As an example, Dallmayr proposes that the current theocratic element in the Iranian constitution be transferred to an upper legislative chamber with either legislative powers equal with the lower chamber or a delaying or advisory role. In either way, religious belief would have a role in the workings of government but not be authoritative over law and policy.

In a concluding chapter that focuses in part on Asia, Dallmayr suggests that there can be democracies with Confucian or Hindu characteristics. From Gandhi and India he sketches a model of democracy that focuses on self-mastery and flourishing of human abilities specifically to avoid the pitfalls of self-centered liberalism and arbitrary assertion of individual preference. From East Asia, he describes a democratic possibility that focuses on relationships between humans and on human relations to nature and the virtues required to develop those relations properly. What he seems to want us to come away with is respect for other ways of living and self-governance, an appreciation for the importance of civic virtues and the importance of proper human ends.