The Pseudo-Platonic Seventh Letter

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Myles Burnyeat and Michael Frede, The Pseudo-Platonic Seventh Letter, Dominic Scott (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2015, 224pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198733652.

Reviewed by Charles H. Kahn, Emeritus Professor of Philosophy, University of Pennsylvania


The Seventh Epistle is once again a subject of controversy. When I was a graduate student in the 1950's, the question of authenticity seemed to have been settled. None of my teachers (including David Grene and Kurt von Fritz) ever expressed any doubts that this letter was an authentic work of Plato. Nor had the schools of Werner Jaeger and Friedrich Solmsen regarded this as a matter of controversy. (After initial skepticism, Wilamovitz had also embraced the letter.) However, to my surprise, skepticism began to reassert itself in the late 20th century, notably in the book of Ludwig Edelstein (1966). The denial of authenticity has now achieved definitive support in this volume, which reflects a 2001 Oxford seminar by Michael Frede and Myles Burnyeat.

Frede died in 2007. The current text was reconstructed from his manuscript and was clearly not designed for publication. The first three chapters are concerned with spurious letters attributed to Plato, Archytas and Speusippus. These chapters offer a useful survey of the later tradition of make-believe correspondence between long dead philosophers. Chapters four and five offer Frede's reasons for rejecting the Platonic authorship of the Seventh Letter. One of these reasons for doubt seems to rest on the mistaken claim that the Letter reflects only Plato's doctrine in the Republic and not that of the Laws. This error is corrected in Dominic Scott's commentary (p. 96). Scott claims, however, that Frede is nevertheless justified in maintaining that the view of Dion as a philosopher "in the strong sense required by the Republic" is unworthy of Plato (p.97). And in fact the high regard for Dion and the great sense of loss from his death is one of the most striking features of the letter. Is this attitude the mark of a forger? Or is it rather an expression of Plato's great personal attachment to Dion?

Burnyeat's contribution falls into two sections. Part 2 contains a brilliant, detailed commentary on the Letter as a literary document (pp. 135-92). Part 1 is a briefer study (11 pages) of the philosophical interlude (341c-345c) designed to explain why there can be no literary expression for Plato's central metaphysical insight. Burnyeat claims that this passage reflects a faulty inference from the conventionality of language to the failure of words to designate the essential reality of things (p. 122). The weakness here of the "one and only one attempt at a philosophical argument" shows that the author of the Letter is a "philosophical incompetent. He has read masses of Plato with great attention" but without understanding (p. 132).

It is not easy to locate in the text the argument that Burnyeat finds so incompetent. Instead we find some general comments on the limits of philosophical writing.

There is no treatise (suggramma) by me on these subjects, nor will there ever be. For it is by no means statable (rhe-ton) like other topics; but from much study of the subject and from living with it, suddenly, as from a leaping fire, a light comes to be in the soul which now feeds itself (341c).

The author goes on to remark that if these matters could be adequately communicated to a general public, "what finer act could be performed by us in our lifetime than to write something of great benefit to mankind and to bring the nature of things to light for all to see?" But such an exposition would be useful only "for a few who would be able to discover it themselves with a brief hint," whereas for most auditors it would be the object either of unjustified contempt or of empty pride. We recognize here a direct statement of the negative view of philosophical writing that we know from a more elegant formulation at the end of the Phaedrus (276d). (I am happy to note that Burnyeat recognizes as genuinely Platonic these very strong comments in the Letter on the limits of writing in philosophy, pp. 164-7.)

What I find in this section of the letter is not a clumsy deductive argument, as Burnyeat claims, but rather an impressionistic sketch of the human condition designed to emphasize its limited contact with reality. The technical terminology here for the distinction between essential and accidental predication (to ti versus to poion ti) deviates slightly from the terminology of the dialogues, a deviation that Burnyeat sees as a sign of inauthenticity (p. 128). But we may just as well see it as another contrast between the literary refinement of the dialogues and the less careful style of the letter.

Aside from this technical section on epistemology, the most interesting topic of the letter is not the disastrous political intrigue with Dionysus II (for which Plato can express only painful regret) but rather the report of Plato's own political education. This began with his initial sympathy with the regime of the Thirty Tyrants (several of whom were members of Plato's family) and continued with his sustained ambition for a political career in the restored democracy, an ambition he abandoned only at the age of 40, at the time of his first voyage to Sicily (324b-326b). I find it difficult to believe that anyone other than Plato himself would want to report this initial sympathy with the oligarchs, as well as his prolonged political ambition. The two references to Socrates are also very striking: Socrates' refusal to cooperate in the legal murder of Leon of Salamis and his own unjust execution for impiety. Socrates is identified in the Letter as "my older friend, whom I would not hesitate to call the most just man of his time," and his condemnation for impiety is reported as "a most impious charge and least fitting for Socrates" (324e1, 325c1). Some readers have been suspicious of these references to Socrates as a moral model rather than an intellectual influence. (Thus Burnyeat, p. 145, complains here of "this lack of grace towards his mentor.") To my ears the reference to Socrates as a moral hero rather than as a philosophical teacher has the ring of truth.

Thus Burnyeat's argument for inauthenticity is, in my view, quite unconvincing. On the other hand, his detailed commentary on the Letter (from pp. 147 to 192,) is rich in careful reading and sensitive interpretation. Burnyeat's sympathetic review of the contents of the Letter often reads as if the author was Plato himself, not some later imitator. The only exception is the Letter's reliance on "a very traditional Greek conception of divinity, going back to the Iliad" (p. 189), a reliance that Burnyeat finds impossible for Plato. Those of us who hear Plato's voice throughout the letter will find this use of traditional theological language of literary rather than philosophical significance.

In summary, despite the problematic inclusion of Frede's unedited comments and the failed attack on the philosophical section of the Letter, we must be grateful to Burnyeat for this line-by-line commentary, which provides a major aid for all readers of this difficult text.