The Pursuit of an Authentic Philosophy: Wittgenstein, Heidegger, and the Everyday

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David Egan, The Pursuit of an Authentic Philosophy: Wittgenstein, Heidegger, and the Everyday, Oxford University Press, 2019, 256pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198832638.

Reviewed by Filippo Casati, Lehigh University


In this book, David Egan argues that at the very heart of Heidegger's and Wittgenstein's philosophies lies an interest in our everyday engagement with the world. Far from being concerned with hyperuranic matters, both Heidegger and Wittgenstein focus their attention on what is too often overlooked as ordinary and, therewith, undeserving of philosophical attention: nailing spikes, resting on chairs, wearing shoes and, of course, how we use our language as well. On the one hand, Heidegger begins his philosophizing from the examination of our engagement with ready-to-hand entities. Chairs, hammers and shoes are ready-to-hand because they are tiles in an intricate mosaic of other entities, activities and social relations which, altogether, make them meaningful and familiar. On the other hand, Wittgenstein's point of departure is our engagement with words. As with Heidegger's ready-to-hand entities, words are meaningful and familiar because they are one of the many interwoven tiles in that mosaic of concepts which Wittgenstein calls 'forms of life'. Then, by echoing Cavell (1979), Egan urges us to notice that these two thinkers aim at retrieving our philosophical understanding from the temptation of neglecting our everyday.

It is important to notice, however, that the analogy between Heidegger and Wittgenstein runs deeper than this. According to Egan, not only do Heidegger and Wittgenstein focus on the everyday, but they are also interested in the same kind of everyday, that is, the shared one. Wittgenstein believes that it is possible to properly use language exactly because we share 'forms of life'. This shared and pervasive agreement in form of life is what Cavell (1979) calls 'attunement'. We are intelligible to one another because we are part of the same "whirl of organism" (Cavell 1976, p. 52): we share the same interests, the same sense of humour, the same understanding of what is love, respect, faith and forgiveness. Now, following Egan, Heidegger toys with similar ideas. According to Heidegger, ready-to-hand entities are meaningful and familiar in virtue of how one engages with them. Chairs, hammers and shoes are intelligible to us because there is a shared way in which one rests on chairs, nails spikes and wears shoes. This 'one' is neither a single human being nor a group: it is what Heidegger calls das Man, that is, the shared context from which ready-to-hand entities and their intelligibility emerge.

At this point, we need to be careful. From the fact that we are submerged in the ordinary, we should not infer that our everyday is somehow innocuous. Quite the opposite. By reading Heidegger, we learn that we have a natural tendency of falling and disappearing in das Man. Exactly this unthinking absorption in how one does things makes us inauthentic. Egan finds a similar worry in Wittgenstein's concerns about our unreflective practices of explanations. Having said that, Heidegger and Wittgenstein do not simply warn us about the danger of inauthentic existence; they also suggest how to evade it, and they do so by appealing to all those situations in which the ordinary appears in all its uncanniness. While Heidegger argues that, through anxiety, we face the groundlessness of our everyday, Wittgenstein believes that the same kind of uncanniness can be met in dealing with scepticism. While, according to Heidegger, anxiety makes the familiar and meaningful context of ready-to-hand entities vanish, Wittgenstein questions the very possibility of having a final explanation which could lead to any sort of solid understanding. Here, Egan suggests that exactly these wounds opened in our everyday by Heidegger's anxiety and Wittgenstein's scepticism might give us the opportunity to live authentically. And I take the heart of Egan's book to spell out how this is so.

In order to meet this challenge, Egan begins by taking a clear stand on Wittgenstein's scepticism. Against the approach defended by Kripke, Egan does not believe that we need to acknowledge the groundlessness of our everyday and repair our dearth of ultimate explanations by appealing to communal conventions. If Kripke teaches us how to live without final explanations, Egan prefers an alternative approach. Following Cavell, he argues that the very attempt of seeking a final explanation is somehow misplaced. Briefly, the reasoning goes as follows. In running out of explanations, we hit what Wittgenstein calls a bedrock. Contrary to the conventionalist reading defended by Kripke, Egan takes this bedrock to be our attunement. Now, lamenting a lack of explanation for such a bedrock presupposes that it makes sense to wonder if such a bedrock might have an explanation in the first place. However, this is exactly what is not possible because it would mean to contemplate our form of life from outside or, as it were, from sideways. Then, Egan concludes, if we are able to jettison the idea that it makes sense to wonder about the possibility of explaining such a bedrock, the sceptical issue, without losing its philosophical and existential importance, becomes somehow less cogent. And this is what Egan calls an authentic approach to scepticism. What about Heidegger, then?

Well, according to Egan, if we look at the secondary literature, it is possible to find a Kripkeanesque way of engaging with the issue raised by anxiety. There is a sense in which, as in Kripke's approach to the sceptical problem, the exegesis defended by the likes of Dreyfus and Rubin (1991), and Friedman (2000) shows how anxiety forces us to face the groundlessness of our everyday life. For this reason, these scholars conclude that we need to be resolute in living a groundless existence in full awareness of our walking on the abyss. Against this idea, Egan argues that what Heidegger aims at doing is more in line with what the authentic solution to scepticism suggests. He believes that, in anxiety, we confront our everyday, that is, the context in which entities make sense, as something that repels our sense making. For this reason, anxiety appears to be not less existentially relevant, but certainly less terrifying than it might seem: since we cannot think about our everyday as something we can make sense of, making sense of our everyday cannot be something we fail to do either.

In this theoretical framework, Egan develops his elegant account of authenticity. Egan argues that whoever is authentic does not transcend or abandon the everyday; on the contrary, she finds herself within it. In order to explain this idea, he proposes an analogy with theatrical improvisation. As an actor engaging in free-playing needs to find the right balance between conventional responses to the other actors (therewith, making the whole performance boring) and arbitrary responses to the other actors (therewith, making the whole performance chaotic), authentic human beings need to find the right balance between vanishing into the everyday and aspiring to transcend it. Given the Heideggerian framework, we can also say that, in order to be authentic, human beings need to resist the temptation of falling in das Man without simply neglecting its importance. As in the theatrical example, both disappearing in das Man and neglecting its importance are forms of inauthentic existence which condemn our own lives to being either alarmingly boring or dangerously chaotic. Authenticity and, with it, the uniqueness of our engagement with the everyday is possible only in relation to das Man. We can engage with a chair in a unique way (e.g., stepping on it while giving a speech in Hyde Park) only if we know how one usually engages with chairs (e.g., resting on them).

According to Egan, it is possible to find a similar line of thought in Wittgenstein's philosophy. As we have already anticipated, we understand each other because we share an agreement in form of life. We are attuned. However, exactly because we are attuned, we can also project our expressions in new contexts and, consequently, we can use our language in an original way as well. As we authentically engage with chairs only in virtue of how one usually uses chairs, we can authentically employ our language only in virtue of our shared attunement. We can understand what it means to 'feed the meter' because we are already attuned to other, more common, expressions, such as 'feed the kitty' (cf. Cavell 1979). Now, this acrobatic ability to keep our balance between rigid conventions and pure arbitrariness, between das Man and groundlessness, between attunement and projection, is nothing else than our ability to be authentic.

Needless to say, a philosophy of authenticity requires an authentic way of philosophizing. Concerning this matter, Egan argues that both Heidegger and Wittgenstein feel the necessity to reject the canonical way of articulating philosophical discourse. According to the former, philosophical assertions cannot properly talk about the everyday and, for this reason, Heidegger employs formal indications. Instead of asserting something about our everyday, Heidegger's essays simply point out our comportments towards it. Moreover, after arguing that formal indications are not radical enough in divorcing one from assertions, Egan presents Wittgenstein's attempt to overcome a traditional philosophical style. In particular, he shows that, against Heidegger's diegetic approach to philosophy, Wittgenstein introduces a mimetic one. While Heidegger describes, let's say, anxiety, Wittgenstein enacts it by weaving the sceptical voice into stylistic remarks that signal disturbance, distress and angst. And, on these stylistic remarks, Egan's tour de force ends.

What I have written until now is nothing more than a map that might be useful to navigate Egan's work. Of course, his book is far richer than I have described. In order to highlight its general narrative, I found myself forced to overlook many significant ideas. The relation between the therapeutic and existential reading of Wittgenstein, the debate about realism and idealism, the discussion about Heidegger's account of responsiveness are all important topics that unfortunately did not find a place in this review. It is also fair to mention that exactly the overwhelming richness that has thrilled me so much might concern other readers. It is easy to imagine the disappointment of a scholar on discovering that Egan (while discussing so many different aspects of Heidegger and Wittgenstein) omits her favourite account of anxiety or her preferred way of understanding scepticism. And, to be fair, such a worry would not be completely ungrounded. It seems to me that, while Egan carefully engages with the secondary literature on Wittgenstein, his interpretation of Heidegger might appear to be less engaged. For instance, Egan takes his understanding of readiness-to-hand to be uncontroversial, but it would have been important to mention that many other interpreters oppose it (cf. Inwood and Blattner). Another example is represented by the importance that Egan gives to formal indication; I believe it would have been helpful to address some of the scholars who have openly and famously denied this idea (cf. Lafont and McManus).

Regardless of these minor issues, Egan's work has an extraordinary virtue. It seems to me that it embodies what the book itself is about: it represents an attempt to do philosophy in an authentic way. In order to see this, it is important to acknowledge that Egan's research indeed has noble ancestors. I struggled to read his account of authenticity without thinking about Cavellian modernism (1976). As Egan's authentic human being, Cavell's modernist is in a state of equilibrium between traditionalism, uniquely focused on past conventions, and modernization, uniquely drawn to arbitrary novelty. It is even more difficult to arrive at the end of Egan's book without hearing the echo of Mulhall's words on the ordinary in Wittgenstein and Heidegger (1994). Not to mention that the remarks on Wittgenstein's style strikes me as having a perfectionist flavour as well (cf. Mulhall). Now, Egan's philosophy is authentic exactly because, in facing such a conspicuous philosophical heritage, it does not vanish. On the contrary, from such a rich philosophical background, Egan develops new ideas and draws attention to some, yet unexplored, aspects of Heidegger and Wittgenstein's philosophies.

All things considered, there is absolutely no doubt that Egan's book is engaging, insightful and deeply original. He covers a lot of different topics with competence and remarkable clarity. In a philosophical landscape in which philosophers hesitate to endorse controversial views, his book is refreshing and stimulating. It has the invaluable merit of showing us that the possibility of doing philosophy, and doing it authentically, is still alive.


Blattner, William D. (2006) Heidegger's 'Being and Time'. London: Continuum.

Cavell, Stanley. (1976) Must we mean what we say? A Book of Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Cavell, Stanley. (1979) The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality and Tragedy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dreyfus, Hurbert and Rubin, Jane. (1991) 'Appendix: Kierkegaard, Division II and Later Heidegger' in Hurbert Dreyfus Being-in-the-world: A Commentary on Heidegger's Being and Time. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Friedman, Michael. (2000) A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, and Heidegger. Peru: Open Court.

Inwood, Michael. (1999) A Heidegger Dictionary. Oxford: Blackwell.

Lafont, Cristina. (2002) 'Replies', Inquiry 45: 229-48.

McManus, Denis. (2013) 'The provocation to look and see: appropriation, recollection and formal indication' in David Egan, Stephen Raynolds and Aaron Wendland (eds.) Wittgenstein and Heidegger. Abingdon: Routledge.

Mulhall, Stephen. (1994) 'Wittgenstein and Heidegger: Orientations to the Ordinary', European Journal of Philosophy 2: 143-64.