The Puzzle of Existence: Why Is There Something Rather Than Nothing?

Placeholder book cover

Tyron Goldschmidt (ed.), The Puzzle of Existence: Why Is There Something Rather Than Nothing?, Routledge, 2013, 295pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415624657.

Reviewed by Ricki Bliss, Kyoto University


Questions that aim at an answer to the puzzle of existence would appear to have fallen on hard times. Queries such as 'why are there any beings at all?', 'why are there any contingent beings?', 'why are there any concrete beings?', 'why are there the contingent/concrete beings that there are?', 'why do concrete/contingent beings exist now?' and 'why is there not a void?' are often thought to be unanswerable, meaningless, answered by branches of empirical science, the purview of theology, the grandest and deepest of questions, boring, ill-formed, outdated, misguided or just plain silly. This fine collection reminds us that the puzzle(s) is(are) in fact pervasive, slippery, and seductive; and if boring or just plain silly, arguing that this is the case, and assessing what this means for other of our commitments, is no small task.

This book covers an array of issues associated with, and approaches to variations on, the puzzle(s) of existence. As one might expect, cosmological arguments, the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR), subtraction arguments, metaphysical nihilism and God all make appearances. But this diverse and engaging collection also has discussions of methodology, mereology, the limits of scientific explanation, the good, modality, causation, probabilistic explanation and theory choice, amongst others.

The volume opens with the editor's concise but informative discussion of how to understand the various questions that the papers deal with, along with a survey and evaluation of the answers that the contributors provide. The papers are arranged into groups depending upon their approach to versions of the puzzle, with the volume culminating in papers that challenge the question(s) and the ways we have typically set about responding to it(them).

Answers to questions such as 'why is there anything at all?' or 'why are there any contingent beings?' are said to aim at ultimate explanations. Historically, such ultimate explanations were thought to be provided only by God. In his essay, Timothy O'Connor defends the view that an ultimate explanation of why there are any contingent things should involve appeal to a necessary and transcendent being. This is followed by Graham Oppy's contribution in which he argues that it is more likely that a naturalistic ultimate explanation of why a world containing causally efficacious beings obtains will succeed.

Next are Shieva Kleinschmidt's and Jacob Ross' very interesting essays on the PSR, a topic hardly avoidable in any discussion of why there is something rather than nothing. Kleinschmidt argues that inductive arguments for the PSR fail but that there is an explanatory principle in the vicinity - the notion of explanatory power - that will give us the results that we want without the consequences that we don't want. Ross, on the other hand, argues that arguments against the PSR fail, but the reasons for which they fail divest cosmological arguments - in which the PSR plays an important role - of much of their power. Continuing the theme of cosmological arguments, Christopher Hughes takes on another commonly employed assumption, which is that the collection of contingent beings forms a whole, arguing that the relevant kind of cosmological argument doesn't require such a premise anyway.

Earl Conee offers an intriguing discussion of Anselm's argument for a Greatest Conceivable Being and defends the view that a version of the argument, revised in light of its most compelling criticisms, fails nonetheless. This is followed by John Leslie's defense of a form of extreme axiarchism, the view that the universe exists because it is good that the universe exists, and the good is creatively efficacious. To my mind this paper is the most adventurous and controversial in the collection, as one might expect from a paper whose title is 'A Proof of God's Reality'. Although Leslie's axiarchism is unorthodox, his essay makes a fascinating and refreshing contribution to the issues treated in this volume.

The next section takes a tour through arguments that deal with the thought that there has to be something because there couldn't fail to be concrete beings. David Efird and Tom Stoneham's methodological piece explores how to adjudicate conflicts in our modal theories, particularly when we want to construct them so they allow for the possibility of there being nothing concrete at all. In contrast, John Heil argues or, rather, states that he has problems with the thought that there could be nothing whatsoever. He goes on to argue that, as is so often the case, we cannot take assumptions about contingency for granted: they must be defended as with our assumptions about necessity. E. J. Lowe offers a reworked version of an argument he has presented elsewhere: that although there may be no abstract objects, were there to be abstract objects, there must also be contingent objects. Finally, Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra picks up a discussion of subtraction arguments and metaphysical nihilism. He introduces a notion of concrete* -- sidestepping certain issues therewith -- to argue that it is possible that there is nothing that is concrete*, from which it follows that it is possible that there is nothing concrete more broadly construed.

At this point the volume leaves off discussion of many of the old chestnuts associated with the puzzle(s) of existence and turns to probabilities. Matthew Kotzen argues that probabilistic answers to the questions of why there are any contingent beings, or any material beings, fail because we are not entitled to assign the probabilities that would afford us such answers. Next, Marc Lange argues that we may be able to explain why there are any contingent beings at all by appeal to the laws of nature. Provided we have a suitable notion of non-causal scientific explanation, we can explain contingent things without needing then to explain the laws that, although contingent, explain those things. Stephen Maitzen, also operating with a non-causal notion of explanation, argues that we need not invoke anything more exciting than objects such as penguins, plums and pens to explain why there are any contingent things at all.

Finally, Kris McDaniel suggests that the questions this volume is engaged with are shallow, rather than deep. This is because they do not employ joint-carving, or fundamental, distinctions. Exploiting his existing work on modes and degrees of being, McDaniel suggests that better questions might be 'why are there any things with such-and-such a degree of reality?'. He is also suspicious of the depth of these questions.

Why is it that the cosmological questions that this collection deals with have been neglected in recent times? Perhaps it is the long history of the role that God has commonly played in these arguments, the thought being that one way to avoid positing God's existence is to avoid asking the questions that typically lead us there. Or perhaps we might lay the larger part of the blame for the decline in interest at the doors of Hume and the empiricist tradition that he inspired.

In Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Hume argues that we simply have no need to go beyond the collection of contingent things -- the parts of the cosmos -- to explain why it is that the cosmos exists.[1] Russell, following Hume, was of the view that since we do not experience the universe but only some of its parts, we cannot ask for the cause of the universe.[2] The universe just is. By the time the analytic tradition was in full swing, with the influence of logical positivism and Quinean naturalism bearing down upon it, cosmological concerns seemed to have disappeared over the horizon. As Heil, however, points out in his essay: 'by establishing a settled space of possibilities, an antique, discredited -- or at any rate repudiated -- thesis can continue to exert a powerful gravitational pull on our thinking' (p.167). The truth of this claim would seem to bear itself out on the pages of this collection, and, indeed, in perhaps surprising ways in contemporary arms of the tradition.

One can't help but wonder if the bourgeoning literature on fundamentality, for example, is not just a cloaked expression of our failure to liberate ourselves from deep-seated cosmological convictions. Notions of ground, metaphysical explanation, structure and fundamentality do a lot of heavy lifting in much of the contemporary literature. These discussions are connected to, and have consequences for, debates not only in metaphysics, but also in the philosophies of science and language, ethics and epistemology, amongst others. Somewhat surprisingly, however, the relationship between the puzzle(s) of existence, and how and why we set about trying to answer it (them), and the doctrine of fundamentality, appear to have gone all but unnoticed. This is interesting considering that many versions of cosmological arguments, for example, were formulated in terms of a non-causal explanatory principle, and much of the language and reasoning employed by the modern day foundationalist seems to have been ripped right from the pages of Summa Theologica or On the Ultimate Origination of Things, or similar texts.

As this collection indicates, the kinds of issues the puzzle(s) raise, how we think we should deal with them, and what this means for other of our commitments is complex and seemingly not conducive to much consensus. So why is it that when it comes to contemporary talk of fundamentality, with very limited exception, no one seems to challenge the idea that there is something fundamental or that whatever is fundamental is contingent? Perhaps the reason is just that whatever folks interested in fundamentality take themselves to be interested in, it has nothing to do with answering questions such as 'why does anything exist at all?'. But this claim is much harder to sustain when we consider some of the reasons we are often given for believing there is something fundamental.

One such reason is the threat of looming vicious infinite regress. Regress arguments can be reconstructed in a variety of ways. Suppose that A depends on B, and B on C, and so on, although at each stage of the regress we have explained something about each of our relata. If the regress is vicious and, thus, unacceptable, there must be something missing. The thought seems to be that although each dependent fact is explained by the facts upon which it depends, no dependent fact can be fully explained by other dependent facts. Other folks have worried that where our dependence chains do not terminate 'being would be infinitely deferred, never achieved'.[3] Or perhaps the real concern is that, while we can explain each dependent fact, what we have not explained -- where there is nothing fundamental -- is the totality of all dependent facts.

These demands are interesting because they tie both into the PSR and the idea of ultimate explanations. The demand for complete explanations, or for an explanation of the totality of dependent facts, appeals to some version of a PSR because, in the first case, we insist that at least a subset of facts have not only explanations but full explanations; and, in the second case, because there is some new thing -- the totality of dependent facts -- it also has an explanation. The worry over being would seem to suggest that what we are after is an explanation for where being comes from -- how anything gets to be at all. These reasons to posit the existence of something fundamental appear to be driven by a desire to explain how any dependent things exist, or how anything exists at all, or questions of the like. They seem to be driven by variations on the puzzle(s) of existence.

We need not rely on reconstructions of tersely presented regress arguments to the existence of something fundamental to suspect that something cosmological is at issue here; the literature is littered with references to the need for ultimate explanations. If for no other reason, this ought to make us wonder whether the explanatory project the modern-day foundationalist is on is not the same kind of project -- or a variation of it -- that philosophers of  certain stripess have continued to return to for centuries, the kind of project that also occupy these essays.

Taking our cue from this volume, many of the discussions offered by its authors seem relevant to, or adaptable into, discussion points for the doctrine of fundamentality. We might adopt Maitzen's compelling arguments against the claim that contingent concrete things cannot explain how any contingent concrete things exist at all -- arguments against the need for ultimate explainers -- to explore whether we, in fact, need independent facts to explain how any dependent facts exist.

Also instructive is Ross' treatment of cosmological arguments and the PSR. He draws to our attention, amongst other things, the difficulty with not only how to understand what he refers to as 'the Grand Inexplicable', but also how (whatever we have to say about it) it will be involved with, for example, our other commitments in the metaphysics of sets and propositions. In the case of fundamentality, then, we can also ask what exactly do the fundamentalia explain? Do they explain a Big Conjunction of Dependent Facts? The set of all dependent entities? Does our metaphysics allow that such conjunctions and sets exist, and that they have a certain kind of explanation?

Kleinschmidt's replacement of the PSR with a notion of explanatory power, on the other hand, strikes one as being just the kind of move that the foundationalist would welcome. They could justify enjoying all the explanatory fruits of the fundamentalia without being saddled with any unfortunate consequences, such as needing to provide a principled distinction between things we can justify needing explanations for and things we can justify not needing explanations for.

And O'Connor, Oppy, Heil, Lange and Maitzen, in their different ways, provide good reasons to think much more seriously about the modal status of our ultimate explainers. Even if we conclude that they are contingent, in step with the common foundationalist view, what these papers indicate is that there is a lot more to be said for and against this claim than 'of course the fundamentalia are contingent!'. These are just a small sampling of what strikes me as points raised in the collection that ought also to be raised in our discussions of fundamentality. There are many more.

There is much in this volume to disagree with. Each essay assumes, or agues for, claims that many of the rest of us will have trouble with. And for every argument offered and position espoused, we need only turn the pages to find someone who disagrees. But far from being weaknesses, these are the collection's great strengths, for it reminds us how difficult these questions really are, and how uncomfortable the process of thinking them through actually is.

Another great strength of the volume is how much it has to offer to so many different domains of discourse. Anyone with even a passing interest in cosmological arguments, the PSR, metaphysical nihilism, subtraction arguments, methodology in modality, ultimate explanations, God, the limits and purview of scientific explanations and, of course, the puzzle(s) of existence will find something of value in it. And, as I have tried to emphasize, it  also has something to offer to folks working in areas who may not yet realize that certain of their commitments are tangled up in the puzzle(s) of existence.

[1] Hume, D., Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Part 9.

[2] Russell, B. and Copleston, F., 'Debate on the Existence of God' in John Hick (ed.) The Existence of God, New York: Macmillan (1964) p. 175.

[3] Schaffer, J., 'Monism: The Priority of The Whole', Philosophical Review (2010) p. 62.