The Quality of Life: Aristotle Revised

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Richard Kraut, The Quality of Life: Aristotle Revised, Oxford University Press, 2018, 249pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198828846.

Reviewed by Jeff McMahan, University of Oxford


The Stoics believed, or tried to believe, that well-being consists solely in virtue. Yet whether our experiences are good or bad, or satisfying or aversive, cannot be irrelevant to our well-being. Indeed, according to Richard Kraut, our well-being consists entirely in the quality of our experience. This view, which he calls "experientialism," is, like hedonism, an objective account of well-being. But, unlike hedonism, it is not monistic. While hedonists claim that well-being is entirely a matter of pleasurable experience, experientialism recognizes a great variety of forms of experience that contribute to our well-being. According to Kraut, many of the experiences that are important elements of our well-being derive from, or perhaps consist in, the development and exercise of our natural powers as human beings. Although pleasure is among the experiences that are good, it is a "lower-order good." (70, n. 29) There are other forms of experience that contribute more to well-being than mere pleasure does.

It is difficult to imagine a more comprehensive, imaginative, erudite, and meticulously argued defense of experientialism than Kraut provides in this book. As one might expect from an author who has written extensively on ancient philosophy, Kraut's arguments frequently engage with the ideas and arguments of other philosophers, particularly Aristotle and other ancient philosophers, but also McTaggart, Moore, Ross, Sidgwick and, among contemporary philosophers, Hurka, Nagel, Parfit, Temkin, Velleman, and others. Yet the book is not scholarly; Kraut discusses the ideas of others only to the extent necessary for the substantive defense of his distinctive version of experientialism. His book is a fecund source of practical wisdom and is written in a manner that is at once lively and dignified.

It consists of four lengthy chapters that together comprise 69 sections. There is also a final short chapter that summarizes the relations between Kraut's views and Aristotle's. Each section is a short essay on a particular topic, though all are unified by their contributions to the case Kraut makes for experientialism. The issues addressed in the first chapter are for the most part ones that are raised by McTaggart's claim that the life of an oyster containing only "oyster-like pleasures," could, if extended long enough, be superior to the best possible human life of finite duration. Kraut rejects this view and offers a plausible explanation of how a human life even of normal duration can be better than an indefinitely prolonged life of only oyster-like pleasures. There is, he argues, a form of incommensurability between the pleasures of an oyster and the higher experiences accessible to a person (by which I mean an individual with at least minimal capacities for self-consciousness, rationality, and autonomy). The better experiences of persons are, in Ross's phrase, of "a higher order of value" than mere oyster-like pleasures, so that a sufficient amount of higher experience is better than any amount of oyster-like pleasure. (Another point that is compatible with and reinforces the claim about incommensurability is that because the life of an oyster has almost no psychological unity over time, there is no point at which an oyster's interests extend beyond the immediate future. There is, in effect, no self for whom the whole of a long life could be good. An indefinitely long life of one oyster would be no different from an indefinitely long series of lives of different oysters, each lasting only a few hours or days.)

The second chapter examines the relations between well-being and moral virtue. The third is a response to the challenge to experientialism posed by Nozick's hypothetical experience machine, and the fourth discusses a range of issues concerning the relations between well-being and time. One cannot possibly do justice in a short review to the rich variety of issues discussed in the many sections of these chapters. I will concentrate my attention here on two of the challenges to experientialism that Kraut seeks to rebut. One is that posed by the phenomenon of contented dementia. The other is the challenge posed by the experience machine. I choose to discuss these because they are the challenges that continue to convince me that experientialism is mistaken.

Contented dementia

In various sections and passages throughout the book, Kraut discusses three connected issues: the well-being of individuals who were once intelligent persons but are now in a condition of profound but contented dementia; the well-being of children; and how the well-being of the former compares with that of the latter. The more extended discussions begin with a section on Nagel's view of "an intelligent person [who] receives a brain injury that reduces him to the mental condition of a contented infant."[1] Nagel observes that whereas an infant whose mental life is much the same as that of the demented adult is not unfortunate, the adult is the victim of "a severe misfortune." Yet the adult is now in "the same condition he was in at the age of three months, except that he is bigger. If we did not pity him then, why pity him now"?[2] His answer appeals to the claim that "most good and ill fortune has as its subject a person identified by his history and possibilities, rather than merely by his categorical state at the moment."[3]

Kraut's view is much the same: the demented adult, but not the infant, is much worse off than he was (his history) and much worse off than he might have been (his possibilities). But Kraut wonders whether Nagel may mean more -- in particular, "that there is a non-experiential aspect to the injured adult's life, post-injury: it detracts from his well-being now that he was once better off." If that were Nagel's view, he should then believe that "the child is better off than the adult." Kraut rejects this, claiming instead that "the adult and the child are at the same level of well-being." (174)

I find no suggestion in Nagel's text that he accepts the view that Kraut rejects. Indeed, when Nagel describes the adult's misfortune as "an example of deprivation whose severity approaches that of death," he implicitly denies that the adult's dementia has reduced him to a condition that is bad for him, and implicitly accepts that the adult's life remains worth living, though just barely. This is compatible with the adult's having the same level of well-being he had at three months. A few sections later, however, Kraut discusses some passages in my writing in which I do claim that if a person who "previously led a life of the mind" suffers a stroke and lives on for a further year in a state of contented dementia, "the additional year . . . is bad for the [individual] while he lives through it."[4] Whatever Nagel's view might be, I accept that if the mental life of the demented adult and that of an infant are nearly identical, consisting almost entirely in simple, passive, sensory pleasures, the infant has a relatively low but positive level of well-being, while the adult's condition can be intrinsically bad, so that it would have been better for him if the stroke had killed him.

Thus, while I think there is no disagreement between Kraut and Nagel, there seems to be a significant disagreement between Kraut and me. Kraut accepts that the demented adult has the same level of well-being that the child has. And at numerous places he affirms, in opposition to Aristotle, that the experiences an individual has as a child can be good for her while she is a child and can contribute to her lifetime well-being. He writes, for example, that "lifetime well-being is to be assessed by adding together the well-being of smaller temporal parts of life, one of which is childhood," which presumably includes infancy, given that Kraut refers to the three-month-old infant in Nagel's example as a "child." (47, n. 8) And while he concedes -- or insists -- that the well-being of a child cannot reach the higher levels accessible to adult persons, he nevertheless criticizes Aristotle for his failure to recognize "how wonderful many of the experiences of childhood are." (226) He seems committed, therefore, to the belief that the demented adult has the same positive level of well-being as the infant and that the adult's experiences during the period of dementia increase his lifetime well-being.

Yet what Kraut actually says, both in his discussion of my example of the stroke victim and elsewhere, is that insofar as the demented adult has only "oyster-like experiences," these experiences, even when they are both pleasant and intense, are of "a lower order of value" -- indeed, "immeasurably lower in value than the goods that constitute a good life for a human being." (188, 200) Although the demented adult's "lifetime well-being . . . continues to increase" as he continues to have "oyster-like pleasures," his well-being during the period of dementia fails to combine "together into a single sum" with his well-being prior to his becoming demented. "When," moreover, "the only goods that will be available to him are of the lower order of value attained by an oyster, his well-being no longer has a claim to his attention or anyone else's." (188, repeated on 200) Summarizing this view, Kraut writes that

It is not arbitrary to place the oyster-like pleasures that a human being can feel in a separate category from the distinctively human goods that make our lives immeasurably superior to that of an oyster. When all that would be left in a life are those inferior goods, that remainder does not constitute the sort of life that a human being should have. There is good reason to hope to die rather than become that simple organism. (197)

These claims are problematic in various ways. Basking in the sun with a mind devoid of thought is an oyster-like pleasure. It is a less good experience than listening with appreciation to Schubert's ninth symphony; but it is not immeasurably lower. There are indeed moments when a simple physical pleasure of this sort is preferable to listening to great music -- though this is compatible with its being true that, if one could have only one or the other, no amount of basking in the sun could be better than a sufficiently robust but limited series of experiences of the best music.

Perhaps Kraut's view is that it is only when the "inferior goods" are the only good experiences one has that their inferiority makes them not worth having. Yet even this seems implausible. If an unreflective man were to become a castaway on an otherwise uninhabited island on which his physical needs could be easily satisfied, his experiences might consist mainly of basking in the sun, bathing in the warm water, eating coconuts, and other similar oyster-like pleasures. Although his level of well-being would be low, his life could still be worth living. This suggests that whether having only oyster-like pleasures is bad depends on the reason why one has only experiences of this sort. When Kraut writes that "there is good reason to hope to die rather than become that simple organism," perhaps what he is identifying as bad is not a person's coming to have a life that contains only "inferior goods" but a person's becoming a simple organism incapable of experiencing anything higher than those inferior goods.

This is what many of us fear in dementia: the indignity or degradation of being reduced to a condition of mental infancy -- a condition in which one could be entirely content with only oyster-like experiences. Some of us fear dementia not because life in that condition would be less good, even immeasurably less good; rather, we believe it would be bad. It is, moreover, that state of being that would be bad, not the oyster-like pleasures themselves. If a once-intelligent person who is now in a state of advanced dementia has oyster-like pleasures, those pleasures are good for him. His condition would be worse if his experiences were neutral in affect, and much worse if they were experiences of suffering. If his life is bad for him, the goodness of the oyster-like pleasures is outweighed by something else.

The summary passage I quoted suggests that Kraut agrees that it can be bad for someone who was once an intelligent person to exist in a state of contented dementia. The problem is to reconcile this with the broader positions he defends in the book. One possibility is to argue that while life with only oyster-like pleasures is good for an oyster, or an infant, those pleasures, at least by themselves, have a different value in the life of a person, or of someone who was once a person. Only if they are accompanied by "distinctively human goods" can they contribute to the well-being of someone who is or was a person (the latter of whom cannot, by hypothesis, have such goods). But this view is incompatible with Kraut's claim that "pleasure on its own cannot vary in value simply in virtue of what sort of creature feels it." (39) It may also be true that whether oyster-like pleasures have value cannot depend on whether the individual who experiences them has certain higher forms of experience as well.

Another possibility is the one I accept: that oyster-like pleasures are good for a demented adult but are outweighed by the badness of a state of being that is unworthy of someone who has been a person. But this is incompatible with experientialism. What is bad is the degraded state of being. The quality of the demented adult's experience may be wholly good, even if immeasurably less good than the higher experiences accessible to persons.

It is essential to its being bad for the demented adult to continue to exist that he was once a rational, autonomous person, capable of higher forms of experience and action. His present state of being would not be bad for an oyster or an infant, or perhaps even for a somewhat older child or a higher nonhuman animal, such as a dog. We might compare the demented adult's well-being with that of another human adult whose experiences are more or less qualitatively identical, but whose history and possibilities are quite different. (This comparison is a variation of the example from my earlier writing that Kraut discusses in the book.) This other adult was conceived with genes that made it impossible that she could ever have psychological capacities higher than those the demented adult has now. This congenitally severely cognitively impaired adult has at every point in her life been capable of having only oyster-like experiences. Assuming that her experience consists mostly of oyster-like pleasures with very little pain or suffering, this individual has, I believe, a life that is worth living. I agree with Kraut that her well-being cannot reach the levels accessible only to persons, but that is compatible with her life's being good for her. If I am right that the demented adult's continued life is bad for him, even though his experiences are qualitatively identical to those of the cognitively impaired adult, the explanation of the difference is that the same state of being that can be good for someone who has never been a person can nevertheless be bad for someone who was once a person. Whether life in this mental condition is good or bad for an individual depends on that individual's "history and possibilities" -- considerations that are non-experiential.

The view that I find most plausible -- that life with the capacity for only oyster-like pleasures is good for an infant but can be bad for a demented adult -- raises a question to which I have no good answer. If a life of oyster-like pleasures can be bad for a demented adult because it is a degraded state for someone who was a person, why is it not also bad for an infant who will be a person? Why is "the mental condition of a contented infant" not a degraded state for an infant, given that this state is, like a period of dementia, a phase in the life of someone who is for most of that life a person? Aristotle, with whose ideas Kraut is intermittently engaged throughout the book, would presumably have regarded the period of infancy through childhood as a mirror image of the period of mild through severe dementia. Provided that each period would consist mainly of oyster-like pleasures, he would not have regarded either as contributing to an individual's lifetime well-being. But for most of us, Aristotle's view of childhood is impossible to accept. We look back on our early childhood, to the extent that we can remember it, with a wistful nostalgia. And we view infants with delight rather than pity.

There are various possible explanations of the common sense view that infancy is normally a good period of life while advanced dementia is normally bad, even if they are subjectively similar in character. Infancy is a period of development and growth while dementia is a period of decline and loss. But Kraut rejects the view, defended in different ways by Slote and Velleman, "that an upward or downward slope in well-being by itself enhances or diminishes" one's total well-being over the relevant period. (183) And, in any case, differences in the trajectory of an individual's well-being cannot explain why most moments in infancy tend to be good, while most moments of dementia, even if they are moments of contentment, are, in many cases at least, bad.

Another possibility, which might be congenial to Aristotle, is that we do not regard the comparative poverty of our mental lives in infancy as bad simply because it is natural and universal, whereas dementia is an aberration. But even if this were correct, it would merely explain the differences in our attitudes without justifying them. I am left, then, with the brute but generally accepted intuition that a demented adult's having been a person can make his condition bad for him even if he is contented, while the fact that an infant is not a person but will become one has no effect on its well-being.

The experience machine

An experience machine gives one illusory experiences that are subjectively indistinguishable from those one receives from one's causal interactions with the world, except that the experiences one has in the machine are better. Nozick, the inventor of the experience machine, assumes that most of us would be averse to spending our lives in it. But experientialism seems to imply that this would be prudentially irrational. Kraut thus argues that we ought to prefer the illusory experiences in the machine to our veridical but less good experiences of the actual world.

In Nozick's experience machine -- at least as Kraut understands it, probably correctly -- one is entirely passive: one is given illusory experiences of the sorts one has previously requested of the technician who controls the machine and one also has only the illusion of making choices in response to those experiences. Kraut's experience machine is a much improved model. In it, one's mind reacts to the illusory experiences just as it now reacts to events in the world; one's reactions are registered by a technician who then provides satisfying experiences in response. In his machine, though not in Nozick's, one could write a novel. Because the novel would be the product of one's own mind, the machine could not make it better than the boring, illiterate tale it would be, but the machine would provide glowing reviews, huge sales, and the Nobel Prize in Literature. It could even transmit the novel to someone in the actual world. If, before entering the machine, one had wished to have the novel one planned to write published in the actual world, that could be arranged, though it is incompatible with experientialism to suppose that it could matter to one's well-being whether it was actually done.

Kraut's machine is superior to Nozick's in other ways as well. One can interact with people in the actual world -- for example by playing chess with the technician, though presumably one cannot know that one's opponent is different from the other characters in one's experience in being real rather than imaginary. Also, when one enters Nozick's experience machine, one stays there for the rest of one's life. Kraut, however, thinks one ought to plan in advance to spend periodic intervals outside his machine. Yet this seems a mistake, if experientialism is true. When one is in the machine one cannot have memories of life outside it that fail to cohere with one's experiences in it. But presumably if one were to emerge from the machine one would know that one had been in it, if only to account for the time that had lapsed in the world. If one had memories of one's experiences in the machine, one would be shattered to learn that they were illusions. If those one cares about in the actual world had suffered or died while one was in the machine, one would experience remorse and grief at having abandoned them. If they had prospered, one would regret having failed to share their joys with them. More generally, if there would be anything even slightly less than ideal in one's experience on emerging from the machine -- which is unavoidable given that the machine can always provide the experiences reality provides and more as well -- experientialism implies that it would be better for one to remain in it.

I agree with Kraut that many of the types of experience he discusses would be just as good, or almost as good, in his machine. These include tasting good foods, playing chess, playing tennis, and listening to music. I am even open to the suggestion that writing a masterpiece of fiction or producing some other great work of the mind, or even willing certain virtuous forms of action, could be as good, at least where only one's own well-being is concerned, as the same motions of the mind in the actual world. What I, and I believe many others, simply cannot accept is that loving illusory people and having the illusion of being loved by them could contribute to one's well-being in the same way that loving actual people and being loved by them do. This, I think, is what really explains why many of us would not enter the experience machine, at least in any ordinary circumstances. It matters to us deeply that the people we care about are real. I concede that our caring profoundly about this does not prove that it actually matters. And I have to acknowledge that there are people -- reasonable people such as Kraut -- whose intuitions are different. I suspect that here we have reached philosophical bedrock. If, after careful reflection, someone believes that it would be just as good for her to have illusory experiences of illusory loved ones as it is to have qualitatively identical experiences of real loved ones, I cannot think of anything that could convince her otherwise. But neither have Kraut's careful and rigorous arguments succeeded in dislodging my conviction that it matters profoundly to my well-being that those I love should really exist.

[1] Thomas Nagel, "Death," in Mortal Questions (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), p. 5. Quoted in Kraut, p. 173.

[2] Ibid., p. 6

[3] Ibid., p. 5.

[4] Jeff McMahan, The Ethics of Killing: Problems at the Margins of Life (New York: Oxford University Press, 2002), p. 175. Quoted in Kraut, p. 198.