The Quantum of Explanation: Whitehead's Radical Empiricism

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Randall E. Auxier and Gary L. Herstein, The Quantum of Explanation: Whitehead's Radical Empiricism, Routledge, 2017, 370pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138700161.

Reviewed by George Lucas, U.S. Naval Academy


This is an insightful and provocative account of Whitehead's metaphysics by two gifted and determined scholars. It centers on the claim that the key concept in that metaphysical system, the "actual entity" or "actual occasion" (res vera), is an explanatory, illustrative, or heuristic concept (as the so-called "Bohr atom" serves in physics, for example), and decidedly neither a "Ding-an-sich" nor a descriptive account of what "actuality" is actually composed of.

Instead, the authors identify Whitehead's technically challenging metaphysics as his effort to understand "the quantum of explanation" rather than to disclose some fundamental quantum of Being itself. It is necessarily true, for example, that every actuality of whatever sort will consistently exhibit key characteristics of becoming and novelty that constitute Whitehead's "categories of explanation." These include an initial period or temporal duration of novel and creative subjectivity, followed by a subsequent phase of ongoing or "everlasting" objectivity, in which the now-fully-determinate actuality is itself available as a datum for inclusion (or exclusion) in every subsequent occasion of experience.

There is no more fundamental way of explaining actuality than this. But it does not follow from this wholly explanatory account of how things are or behave, that we are then to search (like prospectors with Geiger counters seeking uranium) for distinct "things" we might identify as "actual entities" out of which macroscopic objects are composed. So the authors assert early on (p. 7) that the actual entity "is not a bit of physical existence. It is a conceptual tool that helps arrest temporal passage and the flux of the physical universe." The actual entity is thus not an atom, subatomic particle, or even a Leibnizian monad in this sense of the smallest unit of being. Electrons, protons or quarks remain the smallest units of Being in the conventional sense; it is they that are capable of constituting macroscopic objects. Yet each of these entities (and every other sort of actuality) exhibits, in turn, the explanatory characteristics of discrete "actual entities." Whitehead was searching for a way to give a coherent account of a universe composed of multifarious events of otherwise diverse and constantly changing pattern, and so a basic unit or quantum of explanation is required that applies to such diversity universally. That, as the authors illustrate, is no small task, and it is hardly surprising (they assert) that subsequent generations of interpreters, mostly lacking Whitehead's capacities for logic and mathematical physics, would run off the rails.

Between them, the authors do exhibit these requisite skills for fully understanding Whitehead and put them to good use in this remarkable, highly original treatment. Auxier is an accomplished philosopher, steeped especially in the American traditions of C.S. Peirce and Josiah Royce, focusing on empiricism, the flux of experience, the precise relationship between actuality and wider possibilities, and the pragmatists' cautious approach to "abstraction" as unavoidably increasing the distance between what is actual and thought about actuality. Herstein is a seasoned physicist and computer scientist with an avid interest in philosophy and a lifelong preoccupation with Whitehead's thought in particular.

The result of their fortuitous collaboration is an extraordinary exposé and "deep dive" into Whitehead's approach to a number of significant topics in the philosophy of science, logic, projective geometry and universal algebra, and into metaphysics in its broadest sense. The two authors are extraordinarily well grounded in extant literature and the variant schools of interpretation (the systematic, "genetic" and compositional) of Whitehead scholarship, as well as remarkably open-minded, even-handed and comprehensive in their treatment of important contributors to important sidebars like process theology as well as newly emergent Continental interpretations of Whitehead by the likes of Giles Deleuze and Isabelle Stengers, among many others. The goal of the book itself might be summarized as formulating an extensive re-contextualization of Whitehead's own thought and contributions to philosophy that is relevant and readable in the present era, while in the process correcting or refuting a number of what they characterize as grave errors, misconceptions, or oversights that have accrued over the decades regarding important topics in Whitehead's thought.

Once this conceptual underbrush has been cleared away, they then seek to construct their own original applications of Whitehead's thought to issues of contemporary philosophical and scientific interest that lie beyond that philosopher's original historical purview. They compare their work with similar attempts, over half a century ago, to compose broad interpretive treatments of Whitehead's philosophy by, among others, William Christian and Victor Lowe. But they are quite correct, in my opinion, to claim finally that theirs is a far more extensive treatment than any of those earlier attempts, in part because of the vastly greater breadth and depth of subject matter expertise and philosophical sophistication they bring to bear on this difficult task when compared to earlier authors and treatments.

By identifying his metaphysics as grounded in the process of becoming (rather than of Being as wholly fixed, determinate Substance), Whitehead, on the authors' account, was at pains to demonstrate that "Being" (as the ultimate goal of metaphysical inquiry) in fact exhibits the generic characteristics of a multiplicity of actual entities or occasions of experience or process, each "explained" in turn by the composite structure of the "actual occasion" itself. "Actual entities" or "occasions," as the res verae, are the quanta of explanation that describes the non-substantial, processive nature of "Being" understood as creative "becoming" rather than static substance. This comprehensive project did not lend itself to a cursory analytic or purely logical arrangement of topics and arguments, but required what the authors term a "narrative logic" that crisscrosses the conceptual terrain and approaches specific issues and problems from many different angles. This non-linear methodology (which Wittgenstein also employed in the "Investigations") makes Whitehead's works, like Process and Reality, very difficult to understand.

To add to the complexity, Whitehead experiments linguistically with equivocal terminology to capture the essential features of actuality, early on described in terms of "events," for example, which are subsequently showed to be composed of (or analyzable into) actual entities, which in turn are replaced by virtually equivalent "actual occasions." The authors could not have known this when they were writing this book, but ongoing work on the new Critical Edition of Whitehead, especially his classroom lectures at Harvard from 1924 on, fully supports this notion of a developing metaphysical scheme entailing constant experimentation and search for the ideal terminology. In his second academic year, for example, Whitehead introduced his students to two kinds of actual occasions, the "objective" (or dative), and the "imaginal," which always supervenes upon the objective. By the time Process and Reality is written in 1929, these two distinct species of occasions have disappeared, having been absorbed as the temporal "phases of concrescence" of a single actual entity.[1]

Whitehead, however, unfailingly throughout these experiments ascribes the underlying generic explanatory categories to everything (as he says) "from God, to the most trivial puff of existence in far-off empty space." It is also plausible in principle, therefore, to argue that ordinary macroscopic objects (a chair, for example) likewise exhibit such explanatory elements, and so serve as examples of actual entities. All actualities thus "come to be" as a peculiar togetherness of their material ingredients, subjectively organized around a finite telos ("subjective aim") of their intentional functions and forms, and subsequently endure indefinitely into the future as determinate objects serving ever after as potential elements or "data" for inclusion in the subjective experience of future occasions. Our "prospector" above, mistakenly searching behind appearances for the underlying actual entities out of which they are constituted, need look no further than his or her surroundings for ample examples and illustrations.

This latter view, in particular, is one the authors credit to an earlier philosopher and interpreter of Whitehead, F. Bradford Wallach. They proceed to accuse the community of Whiteheadians in particular, and process philosophers in general, of having stubbornly and cruelly ignored this view in a kind of scholastic cabal, being devoted to what we might term the "mistaken ontology of the 'actual entity' itself." Their book is written polemically, with a decided chip on the shoulder of each of the two authors, who believe themselves and their views, and those like Wallach whom they admire, of having been marginalized or ignored by "mainstream" process philosophers. They see the latter as prisoners of a mistaken orthodoxy, and practitioners of a ruthless form of suppression of alternative views and interpretations (such as these), which are either ignored or savagely attacked and suppressed.

Such complaints are not unmerited, although the entire situational context for such discussions is so bleak as to render the complaints pointless, if not moot. It is, moreover, interesting to see whom the authors praise, and whom they indict for this situation. Certainly, they are within their rights to complain about the unilateral control on publication of research within the "Whiteheadian" or process community exerted by Lewis S. Ford, the founder and longtime editor of Process Studies, the main journal in the field. He was strong-willed, highly opinionated, and iconoclastic, which would have been less of an obstacle had he not insisted on refereeing the vast majority of submitted papers by himself (wholly absent any "blind" review). Work like that of Wallach's (or the authors themselves) might spike his personal interest or pique his curiosity, but (apart from publishing a review of her book from SUNY Press in the late 1970s) he was unlikely to take an interest in publishing materials that took her somewhat unorthodox approach seriously. This was a grave injustice, and the authors are right to complain about it, and to cite her work as an instance of victimization. They seem to include themselves within that community of victims as well.

But in fairness, they would all have to stand in line to register such complaints. Ford himself was a relatively marginal academic figure, whose faculty position at Penn State was lost in a tenure battle that thereafter relegated him to a minor philosophical position without much respect or influence outside of his intellectual circle (i.e., in the American Philosophical Association, for example). The authors clearly admire and respect the work of Robert Neville (who in fact was Wallach's dissertation advisor and lobbied for its publication). Neville might be fairly characterized as a "heterodox" Whiteheadian who struggled -- even as a graduate of Yale's famed philosophy department in its heyday -- with the wider prejudice against the kind of philosophical investigations he conducted, while simultaneously driven into intellectual exile from the narrower community of orthodox process philosophers for not following their neo-scholastic lead.

Even more ironically, the authors heap praise upon the late Charles Hartshorne, a personal idealist and philosophical theologian whose insistence on styling himself as the principal heir to Whitehead's philosophy probably wreaked more havoc and spread more confusion concerning what "process philosophy" entailed than any other single figure in the last century. In short, the entire community against which the authors rail is itself relegated to irrelevance and marginal status. The process philosophy "revolution" is truly consuming its own.

They are right to discern that Wallach herself, and perhaps they, have not been given their due. I have tried over the decades to make a similar case myself,[2] from the standpoint of the wider history of modern philosophy. That historical context further helps explain and unravel the controversies that Auxier and Herstein likewise engage between, e.g., Whiteheadian philosophy and the "evolutionary cosmology" of Bergson and Alexander, and the personal versus absolute idealism of Hartshorne and Brightman, as opposed to the later critical realism of Whitehead, C.D. Broad and Ralph Barton Perry, among others. This philosophical fratricide could at times be bitter, confusing, and ultimately pointless. The mote in their eye has perhaps obscured these otherwise passionate, engaged, and extremely able philosophical pair from discerning the wider malaise that relegates their work, and that of those they both praise and criticize, to the margins of contemporary philosophical culture.

I heartily recommend that all readers who have ever entertained interest in or curiosity about Whitehead read this remarkable and pathbreaking study. The authors, who write with enviable force and clarity, are by and large right on target in their constructive re-interpretations of his philosophy, even if they occasionally exaggerate their judgment of the justice or injustice of history. Hegel was correct in the latter instance: history is a merciless slaughter bench.

[1] A.N. Whitehead, The Harvard Lectures, 1925-27, eds. Brian G. Henning, Joseph Petek, and George R. Lucas, Jr. (Edinburgh University Press, forthcoming).

[2] The Rehabilitation of Whitehead (State University of New York Press, 1989); more recently, I take up this larger question of historical injustice in philosophy in my Presidential Address for the Metaphysical Society of America in 2016: "Anaximander and the Ordering of Time: Metaphysics Viewed from the Margins of History," Review of Metaphysics 70, no. 3 (March 2017): 529-549.