The Quantum Revolution in Philosophy

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Richard Healey, The Quantum Revolution in Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2017, 288pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198714057.

Reviewed by Alastair Wilson, University of Birmingham


Richard Healey is not messing around. His new book on quantum theory promises to overturn most of what we thought we knew about the quantum world (spoiler alert: there is no such thing), and in the process prompt a reappraisal of long-held assumptions about explanation, causation and other core scientific concepts. Quantum theory "is a new kind of science" (p.8) that "is simply not in the business of representing what happens in the physical world" (p.3); our recognizing this fact "should prompt a reassessment of a variety of views in the philosophy of science, metaphysics, and philosophy more generally" (p.9).

Extraordinary claims require extraordinary arguments, and these are a little thin on the ground in places. Healey argues against a number of alternative approaches to quantum phenomena in an interlude, but his heart does not really seem to be in the critical project, and the less interested reader is encouraged to skip this section. Nor does Healey provide any direct argument for his view, beyond a careful catalogue of its potential theoretical benefits -- mostly stemming from dissolutions of interpretive puzzles that afflict other approaches. The strength of this book is in its systematic, passionate, inventive presentation of a distinctive new form of pragmatism in the specific domain of quantum theory. According to Healey, quantum phenomena are best understood by departing from the traditional scientific realism which (he acknowledges) works well enough for understanding non-quantum physics. In one of many memorable turns of phrase: "The point of a quantum theory is neither to conform our thought to the world by describing or representing it the way it is nor to create or mold the world, but to tell us what to make of it" (p. 236). In its main aims, to communicate this new picture of quantum theory to a wide range of readers and to situate it as part of a coherent pragmatist philosophical package, the book succeeds admirably.

The quantum revolution will not be televised. For Healey, there is no adequate way to visualize or otherwise form a positive representation of microscopic reality: apart from a few carefully-circumscribed 'canonical magnitude claims' about systems which interact with their environments in suitable ways, we cannot meaningfully attribute properties to microscopic systems. It is not that we would speak falsely in, say, attributing a definite momentum to an electron in a box; rather, statements about its momentum would lack truth-evaluable content altogether. One of the most unfamiliar aspects of Healey's view is that contentfulness of attributions of properties to physical systems can come in degrees: an attribution of momentum to a heavy atom in a box may have more content than the equivalent claim with respect to an electron, even though neither attains full contentfulness. The required notion of content is explicated in inferentialist and pragmatist terms, drawing on sophisticated recent work by philosophers including Robert Brandom, Jenann Ismael and Huw Price, but this will remain one of the least digestible parts of the overall view for many readers.

The radical nature of Healey's reconceptualization of quantum theory is masked somewhat by his use of the familiar term 'quantum state' to refer to the central mathematical object of quantum theory. Healey talks of a physicist applying quantum theory "assigning a quantum state to a system" (p.76) and of "the physical conditions that back state assignment" (p.89). But since Healey is clear throughout that the state does not function to represent properties of a system, the term 'quantum state' is apt to mislead. True, there is historical continuity in calling the mathematical object in question a quantum state. But according to Healey, the representationalist presuppositions of this previous use are mistaken and should be rejected, and I think the term 'quantum state' should be rejected along with those presuppositions. In the familiar cases of the luminiferous ether, of caloric, and of phlogiston, it is plausible that the failure of certain central theoretical presuppositions associated with the terms (respectively: that the mediator of electromagnetic force is material, that heat is a fluid, and that oxidation involves the emission rather than the absorption of a substance) was responsible for the rejection of the terms by the scientific community and the adoption of alternative theoretical terms. The reconceptualization of the nature of the quantum state that Healey advocates is comparably radical, and he accordingly might do better to adopt a completely new term.

So, what term would be more appropriate than 'quantum state' for the central mathematical object of quantum theory understood along Healeyan lines? One possibility is 'predictor'; while Healey also assigns the object in question an explanatory role, it turns out to be parasitic on the predictive role. What a scientist applying quantum theory does, we may say, is to assign a predictor to a system, to study the time-evolution of this predictor, and to then extract predictions from the predictor. This way of describing Healey's view sheds any unintended implication that quantum theory should faithfully represent the properties of a physical system, but in the process it brings into focus a significant explanatory limitation of the view.

Healey usually calls assignments of a quantum state and of associated Born probabilities 'correct' or 'incorrect', though sometimes they are characterized as 'right' or 'wrong' (e.g. p.253) and sometimes as 'true' or 'false' (e.g. p.256). It is natural to ask which features make an assignment of a quantum state correct, and what it is about these features that explains why the assignment in question leads to accurate predictions of experimental results. By hypothesis, correctness of an assignment is not a matter of representing any properties of the system. So: how does a correct state assignment enable such accurate predictions?

In places Healey hints that the question of why quantum theory works so well simply does not arise from a properly pragmatist perspective. The accuracy of the quantum predictions is just a consequence of quantum theory, and "to believe a probabilistic theory is true is to believe that it is right about the probabilities of events of various types" (p.147); so, someone who finds the pattern of events predicted by quantum theory at all surprising has not really internalized quantum theory. This line of thought is a non-starter, though: what we are after is an explanation of the predictive success of quantum theory, not a prediction of its success as a matter of trivial self-entailment. Elsewhere Healey explicitly recognizes the challenge:

what is it . . . that provides the backing for assignment of one quantum state rather than another? Without an answer to this question . . . following the quantum state's predictions would just be like basing one's beliefs on the pronouncements of an oracle with a reliable track record. (p.87)

Unfortunately, the discussion which follows this clear statement of the concern seemed not to properly address it. Healey writes that "one is justified in basing one's expectations on assignment of a particular quantum state because whatever physical conditions provide the backing for that state are reliably correlated with the statistics it leads one to expect" (p.87). As far as I can see, this amounts to the claim that quantum theory should be treated as a reliable predictor because it is in fact a reliable predictor; and of course such a claim does not help us explain why it is a reliable predictor.

The objection based around explaining the predictive success of quantum theory can be pressed further by asking not just how the predictor is able to make such reliably accurate predictions, but why its predictive powers should be delimited in the distinctive way that they are -- why depending on the circumstances certain properties may be predicted with certainty while others cannot even be meaningfully spoken about, so that what properties are predicable and predictable depends sensitively on the experimental setup. Any substantive answer would, it seems, have to make reference to properties of the system represented; but we are told that no such answer is admissible. So, from a realist perspective Healey's pragmatism amounts to the view that reality is inexplicably yet very conveniently predictable.

Healey adopts quietism in the face of this challenge, maintaining that no explanation of the success of quantum theory can be given in terms of properties of an underlying reality but offering no alternative explanation. He recognises that this is sub-optimal, but argues that more orthodox approaches to quantum mechanics are even worse off. He does indeed raise significant challenges to the main contemporary approaches: Bohmian mechanics, objective collapse theories, and Everettian theories. However, it is difficult to know how to directly compare the problems faced by these theories with the distinctive explanatory gap which, I have argued, is faced by Healey's pragmatist approach. For example, although the metaphysical consequences of Everettianism are radical, that view does not give up on the core idea that scientific theories work by representing reality and the dependencies between its different elements.

There may be good reasons to be a pragmatist, but it still would be prima facie surprising if these reasons were to arise from a particular scientific theory such as quantum theory rather than from broader considerations concerning the scientific enterprise, or the metaphysics of normative facts, or the nature of linguistic communication. Indeed, there is something of a tension in the book concerning how local or global the pragmatist lesson should be. At times, the considerations advanced to support pragmatism generalize straightforwardly beyond quantum theory: for example, the accounts of the nature of explanation and causation offered in chapters 9 and 10 respectively and the inferentialist theory of meaning defended in chapter 12. Healey memorably remarks that "quantum theory reveals what philosophers should have known anyway" (p.203). Yet quantum theory is also supposed to be a new and unexpected direction for physics to have taken, so that we could not have foreseen the need for pragmatism of the quantum sort. It is not always clear which aspects of Healey's view are intended to follow from philosophical first principles and which required justification from empirical results in quantum experiments.

The critique of Healey's pragmatism that I have sketched can be pressed most directly in the specific context of the explanation of quantum phenomena. A very natural complaint about Healey's picture is that it accounts for the predictions of quantum theory, but not for the theory's explanatory power. If all we get from our assignment of a quantum predictor is a pile of predictions, we still lack an explanation of why these predictions are correct. Healey anticipates this complaint, and responds by arguing that we do explain the behaviour of quantum systems when we can both predict their behaviour and identify what our predictions of this behaviour depend on: "quantum theory helps us to see that many otherwise puzzling phenomena were to be expected, and enables us to say what each phenomenon depends on and to answer a variety of w-questions about it" (p.153). In particular, Healey claims, we can use the appropriate quantum predictor to make predictions, and we can identify which circumstances in the situation to be modelled render that predictor an appropriate one. This is certainly useful information to have. But it doesn't explain why any particular event occurred; to do that, we would need to identify not the features on which the appropriateness of the relevant predictor depends but the features on which the event itself depends. And this latter thing is exactly what Healey tells us we cannot do in the quantum context. He takes the explanatory power of quantum theory to extend only to explaining 'probabilistic phenomena' -- reproducible statistical regularities in the data -- and not to explaining particular occurrent events.

Healey's view, from the perspective I have been describing, also fails to do justice to the nature of causation. He heads off the threat of 'spooky' causal dependencies by raising the bar for causation sufficiently high (through invoking a requirement of manipulability of the cause to secure the effect) so that many dependencies which one might take quantum theory to describe -- including those between entangled particles in EPR scenarios -- no longer count as causal. But such a move doesn't, I think, make the dependencies any less mysterious; outcomes of measurements on entangled particles still depend on each other in a substantive non-causal manner which does not, according to Healey, admit of any further explanation.

"Shut up and calculate!" is a physicist's slogan response to quantum puzzlement, often attributed to Richard Feynman but probably coined by N. David Mermin to caricature the Copenhagen interpretation. Healey's approach, sophisticated and reflective as it is, has something in common with this response: although we may speak about the functional role of quantum concepts, we must stay silent about quantum reality. Healey's pragmatist treats quantum theory as a black box for generating predictions for the behaviour of physical systems, and we are not permitted to seek a description of the operations of the black box without transgressing the boundaries of quantum theory. There is a great deal of novelty and philosophical interest in the resulting picture, especially in the connections that are drawn with contemporary pragmatism and inferentialism. Healey's book is sure to become a standard point of reference in the interpretive literature. Still, it seems unlikely that it will deter ongoing attempts to construct descriptions of quantum reality.


This work forms part of the project A Framework for Metaphysical Explanation in Physics (FraMEPhys), which received funding from the European Research Council (ERC) under the European Union’s Horizon 2020 research and innovation programme (grant agreement no. 757295).