The Question of Being and History

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Jacques Derrida, Heidegger: The Question of Being and History, Thomas Dutoit (ed.), Geoffrey Bennington (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2016, 288pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226355115.

Reviewed by Rodolphe Gasché, SUNY at Buffalo


After the translation into English of three seminars given by Jacques Derrida at the Ecole des hautes études en sciences sociales -- The Beast and the Sovereign, Vol. I and II, and The Death Penalty, Vol. I, all published by the University of Chicago Press -- the publication of Derrida's first seminar at the Ecole Normale Supérieure from 1964 to 1965 constitutes an event in several ways. This is the case even though, unlike the later seminars, the earlier lectures do not have the literary qualities and stylistic elegance that makes them accessible to a somewhat larger audience. Furthermore, the earlier lectures presuppose a thorough familiarity not only with Heidegger's work -- at least with what at the time was available in French translations -- but also with Husserl's phenomenology, Hegel's speculative philosophy of history, and Nietzsche's reflections on the use and abuse of history. Despite these challenges posed by the early lectures, I call their admirably precise translation by Geoffrey Bennington in Heidegger: The Question of Being and History an event, first of all, because they recall us to the fact that Derrida's thought emerged out of a debate with phenomenology.

As is often the case, the publication of a thinker's seminars does not necessarily reveal new insights into his or her work. However, in Derrida's case the situation might be a bit different. While his later seminars were written specifically with publication in mind -- with parts of some of them even being immediately published -- the earlier seminars served Derrida primarily to prepare the material for subsequent publications independent of the seminars. It is in this way, therefore, that they provide precious and crucial insights into the formative years of Derrida's thought, and into the laborious analyses of certain issues that preceded the published works of that time, but were no longer explicitly spelled out by them. In addition, the early seminars are a testimony to various philosophical concerns that, perhaps, are no longer as easily perceptible in the published works. This is particularly the case with this seminar on Heidegger. For instance, one of the reproaches directed at Derrida's work has been the alleged ahistoricality of his thought. While this is a criticism that could only arise from an unfamiliarity with Derrida's early work on Husserl (and particularly with his first published study on The Origin of Geometry which has been available in English since 1978), the translation of the 1964-65 seminar can be called an event of sorts because it too, as its subtitle The Question of Being and History reveals, serves as a reminder of Derrida's fundamental concern with the topic of history, and historicity.

Rather than being a simple commentary on Heidegger's magnum opus, the seminar consists of a reflection that takes its departure in Being and Time but that focuses on the difference between time and history, and on whatever the relations are between the two. In the ongoing debate regarding the reasons why Heidegger did not produce the announced sequel to the first volume of Being and Time, this question of the historicity of Dasein plays, indeed, a crucial role for Derrida. As he points out, by inquiring into the historicity of Dasein prior to its determination as spirit or consciousness, Heidegger radically breaks with the two major representatives of the metaphysics of history:Hegel and the late Husserl. And yet, at the same time, these original and in-depth analyses never, as Derrida shows, go beyond the critical phase of the analysis. But, rather than viewing Heidegger's abandonment of the second volume to Being and Time as the result of an impasse, or simply as a passage to what is called the turn, Derrida characterizes it as a "running out of breath [essoufflement]" for a number of essential reasons (153).

One of the unmistakably original insights that Derrida's analysis provides is that the interruption of the continuation of Being and Time did not occur between the first and second parts, but is manifest already in the first part itself. This, he says, is due to an impossibility of positively describing the historicity of Dasein without running the risk of making its original historicity a mere modification of temporality. In a series of subtle analyses of the second section of Being and Time on "Dasein and Temporality," and in particular of Chapter 5 on "Temporality and Historicity" and the final Chapter 6 on "Temporality and Within-Timeness as the Origin of the Vulgar Concept of Time" (which at the time had not yet been translated into French), Derrida shows that apart from the concept of repetition, Heidegger offers no new and original concept for thinking the historicity of temporality in which historicity is rooted. And yet, he argues, this running out of breath of the analytic of Dasein in Being and Time is anything but a failure. On the contrary, this running out of breath at the end of Being and Time is an indication of the "extreme point of Heidegger's intention" (203). Rather than a failure, running out of breath acknowledges the fact that in attempting to define the historicity of Dasein, Heidegger has still been using metaphysical conceptuality -- or in other words, a conceptuality designed to ignore radical historicity -- and that one cannot go on in this way.

Indeed, the choice that Derrida makes to limit his commentary on Being and Time to the "Introduction" and its final section on temporality and historicity is not without good reason. This architectonic decision is significant regarding what he wishes to show. The importance accorded to the "Introduction" reflects Derrida's recognition of the prime function of the "destruction" of the history of ontology that Heidegger advocates as the inevitable requirement for raising, once again, the question of Being in philosophy. Though Derrida argues that destruction is not to be mistaken for an annulment of the history in question, his observation that Heidegger's vigilance is unique within the history of ontology sheds new light on how 'destruction' in a Heideggerian sense is to be understood. In any case, while highlighting the concern in the "Introduction" with the "destruction" of the history of ontology -- without which Being as such, and its difference from beings, cannot come into view -- Derrida argues that notwithstanding Heidegger's explicit evocation of a "fundamental ontology," Being and Time already refers the question of Being to a higher authority than ontology in any sense whatsoever. To make this point, which will certainly raise some eyebrows, Derrida not only has recourse to Heidegger's writings after the so-called turn, the meticulous analyses that he provides of Being and Time are also geared toward demonstrating that what is understood by Being must subtract itself from all ontologies, however fundamental they may be. The term 'ontology' is metaphysical, compromised by metaphysics as onto-theology to such a degree that it cannot serve any longer to frame the elaboration of the meaning of Being. But the importance that Derrida attributes to the theme of destruction in the "Introduction" comes into full light, especially in the second part of the seminar devoted to the discussion of the originality of Dasein's historicity. Undoubtedly, the historicity of Dasein has its roots in temporality, but as the difficulties that Heidegger faces in determining it positively demonstrate, there is something original about this historicity that cannot be reduced to Dasein's temporal nature. Indeed, as Derrida holds, to make time into the transcendental horizon of the question of Being, is strictly speaking, still a metaphysical gesture. The exhaustion or, more precisely, the loss of breath that marks the end of Being and Time is the result of the exigencies that accompany the demand for a destruction of the history of ontology.

The book comes to an end without having been able to provide a positive definition of historicity precisely because almost all of the concepts to which it resorts are compromised by a history of thought based on the privilege of the present, and which therefore are unable to positively account for the historicity of Dasein. Heidegger's insight that the ecstatic temporality of Dasein is driven by the future, that is, by possibilities, and that the past is not a bygone present, but a past future, makes it, in principle, impossible to determine the historicity of Dasein without breaking with temporality, which metaphysics has always thought on the basis of the present. In sum, the point Derrida makes in the seminar is that the destruction of the history of ontology that Heidegger advocates, a destruction without which it is impossible to reach back to the question of Being, also requires the abandonment of the problematic of temporality which is always subject to the privilege of the present, for the benefit of that of historicity. But, paradoxically, in the attempt to finally define the historicity of Dasein in a proper, or authentic sense in Chapter 74 of Being and Time, Heidegger does not go beyond an elaboration of the inauthentic historicity of Dasein, which, furthermore, is discussed only in its rootedness in inauthentic temporality, that is, within-timeness.

As already noted, the seminar is not simply a commentary on Being and Time. Obviously, by restricting himself to a discussion of the "Introduction" and the final section on history, Derrida admittedly abstracts from the whole analytic of Dasein, which represents the center of Heidegger's work. Yet those parts that Derrida focuses on are analyzed and commented upon with extraordinary and uncommon perspicacity. Whatever remains implicit in Being and Time -- for example, the "assurances" that Heidegger has to give himself in order to start posing the question of Being, but which can only retrospectively be justified, assuming that Being and Time can successfully accomplish its goal -- is made thematic. Furthermore, the care with which "the methodological subtleties", that is, the "turns and turns about, this whole labyrinth that leaves you out of breath," are brought into view is simply breathtaking (167). But as the reference to the "labyrinth that leaves you out breath" indicates, the necessity for these subtleties is justified by the (however deferred) success of Being and Time in properly, or authentically, determining historicity in a non-metaphysical sense. Furthermore, if particular attention is paid to the "discrete if not fragile link[s] in the chain of Heidegger's propositions" that are at the core of the schemata of his thought, and to whatever appears arbitrary in his argumentation only because it "hides a profound necessity even if the necessity does not absorb into itself all the arbitrariness," it is to highlight Heidegger's vigilance, more precisely, the "necessity not to determine being-there too soon by another category" that would force upon it a meaning foreign to its ontological nature (80; 87).

Given this unrelenting vigilance with which Derrida credits Heidegger's thought, a vigilance of a sort and a degree previously not found in the history of ontology, one might be tempted to hold that Derrida is subscribing to everything the latter develops, and that his own work is nothing but a repetition of Heidegger's. Yet nothing would be more mistaken. I only evoke here Derrida's critical observations regarding Heidegger's style, and the reasons why the latter chooses certain terms, such as the "house of Being," that originate in "expressionist-romantico-Nazi style" in order to name what is no longer of the order of formal conditions of possibility; or concerning certain discrete and fragile links in his reasoning "on which those interested in anti-Heideggerian strategy or tactics would have every reason to put some pressure" (57; 80).

Rather than a wholesale celebration of Heidegger's thought, the seminar represents a decisive phase in the development of Derrida's own thought. In this context the architectonics of the seminar is of seminal importance. After focusing on the notion of destruction in the "Introduction" to Being and Time, this notion is progressively refined by Derrida as he takes up the question of historicity, and retranslates "destruction" as a "solicitation" -- a term that combines the Latin adjective sollus, whole, or entire, and ciere, to move, stir, or shake, and whose original meaning is thus to move, stir, or shake something in its entirety. With this, Derrida's specific take on metaphysics is beginning to take shape. It is no longer a question of reaching toward a beyond of the history of ontology but of shaking it in all its self-evidences and assurances so that the specificity of philosophical thought, of what it can accomplish and what not, its ambitions and its limits, can manifest themselves at once.

A guiding thread throughout the seminar is, no doubt, the repeated reference to "the ontic metaphor." For example, Derrida highlights Heidegger's recourse to Plato's Sophist, particularly to the Stranger's admonition to leave all storytelling behind when it comes to defining Being in itself and as such, or in other words, to resist all efforts to deduce Being from higher concepts, and, especially, to represent it by way of lower concepts. By highlighting this, Derrida makes clear that the thought of Being, and the quest for meaning, requires the destruction of the metaphor. The work of philosophical thought, that is, the thought of Being, consists in destroying metaphor. But as Derrida's analysis of how, at the end, Being and Time gets out of breath shows, its inability to propose new concepts in order to define in a positive way the historicity of Dasein (because all concepts used to determine this historicity are derived concepts, or ontic metaphors that miss its proper specificity), in turn, demonstrates that the question of Being as such, that is, the philosophical question par excellence, proves to be one that, rather than producing a positive answer to the quest, solicits or shakes metaphysics from within by loosening its threads, without simply rupturing them.

Toward the end of the seminar Derrida briefly sketches out the conclusions toward which the seminar would have headed if, going beyond Sein und Zeit, he had been able to follow the path along which his interpretation took place. In these final pages, the thought of Being as the thought of the non-metaphorical as such (and, hence, also of metaphoricity as such) is shown to hide what it announces, and never to reach the proper meaning of this as such. Indeed, the very gesture by which the thought of Being as such announces the horizon of non-metaphor, "even though it denounces the entirety of past metaphor (onto-theology), happens in a metaphor about which it does not yet know -- because it is irreducibly to come -- what that metaphor is hiding" (324). In sum, this metaphor for Being as the non-metaphoric is, ultimately, the linguistic term of "Being" itself. This very unity of metaphoricity and non-metaphoricity in Heidegger's elaborations on Being suggests that not only the thought of Being, but also that of historicity, runs out of breath because it is structurally linked to an irreducible to come, but also that a new way of understanding the philosophical demand to abstain from storytelling is of the order of the day.