The Question of Painting: Re-thinking Thought with Merleau-Ponty

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Jorella Andrews, The Question of Painting: Re-thinking Thought with Merleau-Ponty, Bloomsbury, 2019, 344pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472574282.

Reviewed by Jessica Wiskus, Duquesne University 


What the reader ought to do, after turning the final page of this book, is pause, reflect, and open it again, back at the beginning. For it is only at the very end of the book that Jorella Andrews suggests what it is that she has been doing all along: composing a treatise (in Benjamin's sense) -- a non-didactic work in which the aim is never to directly express its claims; proceeding "by means of digression" and presenting contrasting analyses from "authoritative" scholars, the treatise inspires a "disjunctive" mode of contemplation (250-251). Andrews tells us that Benjamin likens the treatise to a mosaic, and her point here is that the mosaic, as a work made of fragments, relies upon the participating viewer to discern the whole or meaning of the composition. Yet, I would argue, the viewer of a mosaic has the chance (in most cases) to step back and, at a glance, catch a sense of the composition as a whole; she or he has, as well, the liberty to examine details of the work in an unspecified order. But the treatise proceeds in chapters or "sections that are numbered" (250), and its power to educate the reader derives from the cumulative effect of material presented in an ordered sequence; I would suggest that, for this treatise, a better analogy might be film. It is no accident, then, that the book in fact does not confine itself to questions of painting, but engages most persuasively when it turns to film, from Barbara Kapusta's O's Vocalization (2016) in Chapter 1 to Graham Ellard and Stephen Johnstone's For an Open Campus (2015) in the concluding chapter.

At the outset, Andrews' aim appears to be to apply Merleau-Ponty's thought to the challenges of contemporary (particularly, abstract) painting. But she also reverses this question -- so that her analyses of contemporary art resituate and interrogate Merleau-Ponty's philosophy. In so doing, Andrews asks whether thought can be creative -- i.e., whether the re-positioning of a philosophical oeuvre can make it possible to generate new insight. Remarkably, Andrews addresses this question not only through her interpretation of Merleau-Ponty's texts or her analysis of artworks, but by the very form of her book.

Unlike some academic works -- those that have been composed of separate essays, for example -- Andrews' "treatise" is meant to be read from beginning to end. Although compelled to follow a structure of constantly new departures, the patient reader is rewarded in the final chapter with a realization of how each preceding digression fits within one, whole expression. The excitement that the reader feels at making this discovery (not unlike the excitement aroused by listening to a great piece of music) is a tribute to the specific way in which Andrews structured her book: that is to say, less like a mosaic and more like a film -- at least, film "conceived of not as 'a sum total of images' but rather as a 'temporal gestalt' in which the meaning of a shot 'depends on what precedes it in the movie, and this succession of scenes creates a new reality which is not merely the sum of its parts'" (117). Indeed, this is why Andrews' book -- like a compelling piece of music or a film -- demands repeated encounters; it demands to be read again so that the details of each individual argument can be savored anew, appreciated within the context of a fully-expanded expression (one that could be realized only at the end).

This is what characterizes Andrews' philosophical style. Here there is not an expression that has determined everything to be said in advance -- as in conceptual art, where, in the words of Sol LeWitt, "all of the planning and decisions are made beforehand and the execution is a perfunctory affair" (133). Here there is not a thought that returns to itself in transparency, revealing always the same thing -- like "the investigative strategies of science that conventionally investigate phenomena in order to discover their principles of repeatability" (89). Rather, here there is a creative thought -- truly a "Re-thinking" of "Thought," in a movement of expression that Merleau-Ponty describes as institution (quoted by Andrews in her introduction, page 44), which is:

sense as open sense, which develops by means of proliferation, by curves, decentering and recentering, zigzag, ambiguous passage, with a sort of identity between the whole and parts, the beginning and end.

"Sort of" is the key modifier in this description, because institution denotes a process through which truth is discoverable but not determined in advance: "Merleau-Ponty rejected the objectivist idea that truth exists in-itself," Andrews writes (183). Even philosophical truth does not form a closed system. And this means that what she seeks to achieve by re-engaging with Merleau-Ponty's thought -- a transformation of our understanding of that thought -- is not only suited to the claims of his philosophy but, moreover, called for by that philosophy.

As a "treatise," her book is characterized by excursions in diverging directions, and it is often in this spirit that she brings different "authoritative" figures into play, at times adopting (e.g., Paul Crowther) or refuting (e.g., Graham Harman) their arguments. Her willingness to introduce contemporary views within a fairly strict chronological arrangement of Merleau-Ponty's texts means that certain philosophical terms stand in danger of being taken out of context (such as "real," "subjectivity," and even "phenomenology" -- which have specific meanings for Merleau-Ponty at different periods of his career). However, Andrews is careful to situate each of Merleau-Ponty's texts historically (and this is an aid to those readers new to Merleau-Ponty), and she provides helpful contextualization for each of the works of art that she analyzes, as well.

Andrews structures her book into four main parts. The first, "Painting -- Rethinking thought beyond dualism and positivism," focuses on The Structure of Behavior and shows how Merleau-Ponty challenges the classic opposition of nature versus consciousness, pursuing, rather, a third way -- the way of "naïve consciousness" (75). According to Andrews, for Merleau-Ponty, "sensations are from the first perceived in configurations" (83), embedded within structural wholes (or Gestalten) that exceed their given presentations. Andrews cites the optical illusion known as phi-motion (essential to the experience of film) as an illustration of this insight from Gestalt theory. Fittingly, she turns, in this chapter, not to painting but to a film -- O's Vocalization (2016) by Barbara Kapusta -- to show how the work offers "space and time for revelation, surprise and mutual adjustment" (63). Film suits her claims here because revelation, surprise and change happen not in an instant (e.g., within the span of one still image or frame) but in relation to a dynamic, continuous arc of time (past, present, and future) -- an arc that the viewers of O's Vocalization, as "witness-facilitators" (63), themselves contribute to the expression of the work. Andrews' main point is that this kind of participatory viewing exceeds the dualist framework set up by "both rationalism and empiricism" (80) whereby subject is pitted against object, inside against outside, or consciousness against nature.

The second part, "Painting -- Rethinking thought as perceptual and embodied," focuses on Phenomenology of Perception. Here, Andrews critiques "rationalist and empiricist claims to knowledge" (117) by showing that as "embodied beings whose inherence in the world is always situated within certain physical, emotional, historical and social contexts," what we perceive is informed by "particular desires and goals" that exceed what is presently given (118). Indeed, this embeddedness is also understood within a temporal context, as Andrews clarifies that, "We are never in a position to isolate a present from its past: its relation is not that of effect from cause. . . . On the contrary it is the past that is accessed, 'read', or interpreted through the present and continually assigned new meanings" (124). Accordingly, when she uses paintings as examples, she never makes the mistake of analyzing a canvas in isolation. She selects, rather, paintings placed within an artist's series, like Cézanne's Mont Sainte-Victoire or Still Life with Plaster Cupid, Leah Durner's darkgreylightgreyyellow pour from the Céline series, and Rashid Johnson's Cosmic Slop paintings. Or she selects paintings that take their meaning in relation to other, specific paintings or subjects, e.g., Cézanne's La Femme à la Cafetière, El Greco's Christ on the Cross Adored by Donors, or Pieter de Hooch's A Woman Carrying a Bucket in a Courtyard. That is to say, for Andrews, the series informs the overall expressive meaning of each individual canvas. Likewise, Andrews asserts, the expression of thought is not an isolatable entity, and she suggests that Merleau-Ponty's interest in the tradition of painting helped him rethink the scope of consciousness. She quotes Merleau-Ponty from Phenomenology of Perception:

The life of consciousness -- cognitive life, the life of desire or perceptual life -- is subtended by an "intentional arc" which projects round about us our past, our future, our human setting, our physical, ideological and moral situation, or rather which results in our being situated in all these respects. It is this intentional arc which brings about the unity of the sense, of intelligence, or sensibility and motility. (144)

Significantly, Andrews claims that: "It is at this juncture that the social, political and ethical dimensions of Merleau-Ponty's thought in this regard become apparent" (150), since this "intentional arc" takes into account not only our grasp of ourselves but also the possible views that others may have of us. She cites Merleau-Ponty from the Phenomenology once again:

For the "other" to be more than an empty word, it is necessary that my existence should never be reduced to my bare awareness of existing, but that it should take in also the awareness that one may have of it, and thus include my incarnation in some nature and the possibility, at least, of a historical situation. The Cogito must reveal me in a situation, and it is on this condition alone that transcendental subjectivity can, as Husserl puts it, be an intersubjectivity. (151)

It is this intersubjective structure -- one in which our expressions are woven together with those of others -- that Andrews then connects, in Part Three, to Merleau-Ponty's discussion of style in "Indirect Language and the Voices of Silence." Entitled, "Painting -- Rethinking thought as 'silence' and 'speech,'" Andrews begins by engaging with more contemporary thinkers in aesthetics, namely Crowther, Laura Hoptman, Peter Osborne, and Anne Ring Petersen. Subsequently she turns, drawing on the work of Galen Johnson, to the question of a painter's style, noting that style "emerges in practice" (191), through a zigzag process of institution. Just as, for Merleau-Ponty, language is not a "translation or cipher of an original text" (175), the painter doesn't conceive of style beforehand, as if it were something she wanted to say that the painting is made to represent. As Merleau-Ponty points out, artists often don't recognize their own style -- others do. And so, Andrews argues, style is not "radically subjective" (as Malraux claimed) but intersubjective: it arises as the excess or potential that others, due to their unique embodied stance within the world, are able to see but that the painters themselves cannot see (192). It is therefore also dynamic and changeable, since those others are likely to bring to their encounter a point of view informed by a culture, a history, and an era different from that of the painter's own. In this respect, Andrews makes a careful analysis of Paul Klee's Suburban Garden (Garden City Idyll) of 1926, contending that, through the "artist's own mark-making gestures," we are inspired to "re-live" the movements that Klee had made as he painted (195). But this, Andrews clarifies, is not an operation of mimesis in the traditional sense:

We would be wrong to think that we were reproducing the artist's movements with transparency in our own bodies. For this would be to discount the context-dependent nature of signs so insisted upon by Merleau-Ponty in this essay and, with respect to this particular painting as a sign-system, the divergent ways in which we, as specifically situated and contextualized viewers, will interpret the marks and gestures given to us in this instance. (195)

It is this dynamic exchange -- between the seen and the seers -- that Andrews examines in Part Four, "Painting -- Rethinking thought as 'secret science'." In these final chapters, Andrews focuses on Merleau-Ponty's essay, "Eye and Mind," and his unfinished manuscript, The Visible and the Invisible, developing an interpretation of key terms in Merleau-Ponty's late vocabulary like flesh, chiasm, and hyper-reflection. Carefully, she explicates the invisible not as the opposite of the visible (as it might be conceived in a dualist thought), but as the kind of overage or excess that makes the visible what it is. In place of consciousness-facing-an-object, according to Andrews, Merleau-Ponty describes a sort of exchange of pan-visibility. For, Andrews explains, "it is the general condition of visibility seeing itself that presupposes and preconditions our actual and various experiences of that intertwining of the sensible and the sensing in which we are inevitably immersed" (216). This general visibility -- Andrews once again emphasizes -- presupposes an intersubjective world, one in which multiple visions come into play. Expressing this generative, multi-voiced vision of the world is what philosophers, painters, and other artists are called upon to do. As Merleau-Ponty insisted: "It is not enough for a painter like Cézanne, an artist, or a philosopher, to create and express an idea; they must also awaken the experiences which will make their idea take root in the consciousness of others. A successful work has the strange power to teach its own lesson" (quoted, 125). Andrews concludes then, by turning to two contrasting examples (one a painting, one a film), Koninck's An Extensive Landscape, with a River (1664) and Graham Ellard and Stephen Johnstone's film For an Open Campus (2015), in order to guide us through the possible lessons that they "teach."

An ambitious, erudite undertaking, Andrews' book is most compelling when she speaks through works of art. In her analyses, she displays not only insight into the possible meanings of various works, she also attends to the very process by which she reveals those possibilities. She knows when to disclose something about a work and when to reserve additional revelations for later (as in her interpretation of the donors in El Greco's painting, which she withholds until the end of her discussion). This careful orchestration of the order in which material is engaged testifies, again, to the centrality, in her book, of the notion of institution: the way that a part of experience can become new -- even generative -- when subsumed into an ever-expanding, temporal whole. Despite her claims to have written a "treatise" -- a kind of mosaic -- what she achieves is closer to the effect of film, for it is film that manipulates the temporal order of images into an expressive whole.

And this gets to the heart of her wager in this book: Andrews does not wonder only if Merleau-Ponty's philosophy can be productively applied to an understanding of artistic works that were produced long after the philosopher had ceased to write. Of course, one of the book's merits is the way in which Andrews demonstrates, through multiple compelling examples, that it can. More than that, however, she shows that the reverse is also true: that works of art -- that the expressions of our contemporary context -- can be taken up to re-situate philosophical thought that we had perhaps thought finished, consumed, or even depleted of its potential meanings. At work here is the power of institution. That is to say, Andrews argues that there is yet more in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy that remains discoverable; and her efforts urge us to once again pick it up, to re-think its claims and wonder at its continued relevance.