The Rainbow of Experiences, Critical Trust, and God: A Defense of Holistic Empiricism

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Kai-Man Kwan, The Rainbow of Experiences, Critical Trust, and God: A Defense of Holistic Empiricism, Continuum, 2011, 314pp., $120.00 (hbk) ISBN 9781441174017.

Reviewed by Phillip H. Wiebe, Trinity Western University


Kwan's book is an attempt to articulate an epistemology based on the notion of critical trust, a concept broadly based upon the Principle of Credulity articulated by Richard Swinburne in the assessment of religious experience. Kwan observes that the term 'credulity' does not quite serve the cautious attitude that epistemology requires towards the spontaneous beliefs that experience brings us, so he adopts 'critical trust' in its place. He does not restrict his interest to religious experience, but articulates the place of critical trust to a "rainbow of experiences" that include moral, aesthetic, theistic, and interpersonal experience, as well as our experience of the natural world, ourselves, and more. Kwan offers an epistemology that is an alternative to narrow empiricism (especially), foundationalism, coherentism, Popperian fallibilism, and skepticism.

The Principle of Critical Trust asserts that if something seems to be present to me, epistemically speaking, then it probably is, unless special circumstances exist to the contrary. Kwan acknowledges the role that sense perception plays in giving this principle initial plausibility, then extends the discussion to religious experience without attempting to press the analogy hard. By considering religious experience in the context of finding meaning in life, Kwan broadens his focus beyond the narrow concerns often found in discussions of religious experience by analytic philosophy. Kwan finds a sympathetic outlook in Wittgenstein, whose varied remarks suggest that he embraced a form of theism outside the normal structures of Christianity. Kwan gives expression to his misgivings about analytic philosophy upon first encountering it, and his predilection to empirical holism from his Chinese background; he has evidently found a way of combining the two in what is a substantial study.

The Principle of Critical Trust is the core notion in Kwan's epistemology, but an epistemology that focuses only on what a subject finds plausible does not have the impartiality required of a rational inquiry. So this Principle is quickly supplemented with the Principle of Testimony, Principles of Coherence, the Principle of Cumulative Effect, Bayes' Theorem, and more. The first eight chapters (of eighteen) are taken up with recent debates over thirty or so principles that might flesh out a sensitive epistemology that starts with giving critical trust to epistemic "seemings," and Kwan's discussion has plausibility. The literature on confirming evidence (to which he does not refer) would reveal another thirty epistemic principles for consideration, so that finding a comprehensive epistemology turns out to be a monumental task. I don't think Kwan underestimates this.

It just so happened that as I first read Kwan's book I was teaching my upper-level undergraduate class on the evidential force of religious experience. I had given the students several accounts of Marian apparitions, the first of which were from Garabandal, Spain, during 1961-65, the second from Medjugorje, which began in 1981 and are still reported. My dozen or so students were (nearly) unanimous in asserting the superiority of the latter to the former, in part because the visionaries are older (on average) in Medjugorje than the children were in Garabandal, in part because the visions in Medjugorje are more recent, and also because Garabandal was deemed to be more rural (and backward) than Medjugorje. Perhaps other factors that did not come out in discussion influenced them, as they expressed general skepticism about Marian visions. Confronting epistemic principles with actual alleged accounts is instructive in several ways: The principles become modified so that comparative assessments are introduced; some principles that seem sacrosanct in a theoretical context are readily sacrificed when real engagement takes place; also, no obvious way of evaluating the strength of proposed principles exists, so critical "trust" dominates.

Whether these students in our secular province (British Columbia) are typical of undergraduates elsewhere I cannot say, but I was surprised at how badly they beat up the Principle of Credulity. I surmise that in the hurly-burly of epistemic debate, the events that are described, the theories advanced to explain them, the paradigms in which descriptions and theories are embedded, the numerous methodological principles guiding inquiry, and meta-methodological critical reflections on all four of these domains (philosophy) can all be readily modified or even sacrificed. Religious experience strikes me as profoundly vulnerable to an unpredictable outcome. We can find our way with epistemic questions outside the domain of religion, but religion constitutes a special challenge (ontologically), so that epistemic success outside religion does not translate into quick success within it. Kwan is more sanguine than I about creating a comprehensive epistemology around critical trust; I would opt for confirming and disconfirming evidence, even though a specific measure eludes us. Many independent reports of Marian visions, excluding those from Garabandal, say, confirms their occurrence (to some degree), and their occurrence confirms the Garabandal reports. The Converse Consequence and Special Consequence Confirmation Conditions are operative here, as in evaluating explicitly scientific theories, showing that "rationality" around claims of religious experience is not markedly different than "rationality" around scientific theories. Confirmation conditions also apply to theories in which unobservable objects, or partially observed (or "observed") objects are implicated, and this is important to religion.

In the second half of the book, Kwan sets his sights on "the rainbow of human experience," arguing that his epistemic approach and a theistic framework make the most sense of that experience. Here his argument against scientism and the "narrow empiricism" this scientism has often adopted becomes apparent. He takes Einstein as representative of the outlook he advances, noting that Einstein embraced the ideals of Goodness, Beauty, and Truth, as well as personal theism, rather than an impersonal form of it. Kwan devotes separate chapters to our experience of the natural world, of the self, of existential experience, of morals, of aesthetic experience, of intellectual experience, of religious experience, and of theistic experience. This is what he means by "empirical holism." He includes various examples of people who came to "theistic faith," including some whose experience is distinctly Christian. Kwan does not pause to engage the difficult questions around the empirical claim that God acts in human history, specifically in the person of Jesus of Nazareth, nor does he acknowledge the real and considerable challenges that have been raised in biblical criticism. This transition without argument from general theism to Christian theism is not consistent with the exacting care that marks analytic philosophy.

Kwan makes a crucial probability assessment in each of the categories of experience, comparing the power of theism to that of naturalism. So in his discussion of moral experience he observes that moral duties exist, that absolute evils exist, and so on; in discussing the human intellect he observes "the fact of intellectual dynamism and the transcendent dimensions of reason" (p. 246). He considers the probability of the existence of these on theism compared with the truth of naturalism, and in each of the more than twenty cases considers the former to be greater than the latter. So the "rainbow of experience" favors theism over naturalism. He does not elaborate on the concept of probability that he uses (or needs) to complete his case, but I assume that it is what Rudolf Carnap described as the logical concept of probability. In this Kwan follows Swinburne, his doctoral supervisor, whose efforts to articulate a viable notion of probability in theistic arguments I have critically assessed in an earlier review in this journal (of Swinburne's Was Jesus God?). Probability assessments remain mysterious outside well-worn paths expressing relative frequencies and the classical interpretation.

In the chapter on religious experience itself Kwan surveys a variety of experiences that have been deemed corroborative of a religious or theistic universe. He makes brief reference to encounters with deities or spirits, as well as various forms of mysticism, and experiences of pure consciousness and Nirvana. The all-encompassing descriptive list in this chapter presents his Principle of Critical Trust in a generous form, indicating his willingness to consider religious experience alongside theistic experience. Some authors are less embracing of the numerous kinds of religious or spiritual experience reported by the world's people. Kwan gives evidence here of openness to non-Christian experience, placing his study in a broad framework. Some of this experience implicates the space-time-causal framework in important ways, suggesting that the trans-world realities thought to be encountered in fact exist. Of course these realities might not be exactly as they appear, which is a conclusion drawn by our critical perspective on the world that we have learned from the atomic age. The evidence that he quickly reviews is uneven in terms of its evidential force. The existence of departed saints, for example, is not as recently documented as near-death experience, nor is it generally susceptible to the evidential criteria generally adopted in experimental science. I am sure that Kwan is sensitive to relevant differences in the assessment of religious experience, and he does not evince much difficulty with spirits as these have been understood in Western, and possibly Eastern, thought.

I am struck by how comfortable Kwan is with what Wilfrid Sellars called "the manifest image" of our world, and how modest a place is played in his extended argument by what Sellars called "the scientific image." The difference in analytic styles that I am crudely describing does not do justice to the creative forms that analytic philosophy takes among its practitioners, but the tension behind thinking that "ordinary language gets the world more or less right" and thinking that "science gives us the most complete and perspicacious understanding of the world" is still an important factor in how philosophy is done. Reading Kwan puts me in unfamiliar philosophical space, for he assumes the manifest image without apology and he gives the scientific image only incidental attention. Perhaps my reaction is a cultural one, as Canadian philosophy, first shaped by the philosophies found in both Britain and France, has come under American influence in the last fifty years or more. Although I would not use the term 'scientism' to describe the scientific conceptual framework, in part because the term has a pejorative connotation, scientism is just one expression of this framework. Another attitude is calling the manifest image into question, embracing scientific achievements as they replace (or augment) the manifest image, and adopting a "wait and see" attitude toward those features of the manifest image that have not been eclipsed by the scientific framework.

The tension between the manifest and scientific frameworks arises in at least three vital areas, viz., normative judgments, philosophy of mind, and religion. Kwan considers such judgments as moral and aesthetic to be objective, and they do appear to have this characteristic when we analyze common usage, but pragmatists have offered interpretations of normative language that make no concessions to theism. Talk of mental states is no longer seen to give expression to a dubious ontological order, as cognitive science reconceptualizes this prominent feature of the manifest image. The place of religion in this battle over conceptual frameworks is an object of dispute, although many naturalists seem to regard religion as already having been eliminated. This was the fate once widely predicted concerning mental states, but their reconsideration as unobservable "objects" postulated by a theory allowed them to be retained, perhaps only to be "reduced" as cognitive science matures. A similar sentiment about the entities of religion is not widely mooted -- they have already been removed. However, the prevailing sentiments among philosophers about religion in Great Britain, where Kwan studied, and Hong Kong, where he teaches, might be different than what I perceive here in Canada. I gather that philosophers in the US are sharply divided over religion.

Kwan restricts his attention in this book to the argument for theism from experience, but he considers the design argument to be a powerful one (p. 141); I surmise that he might endorse a cumulative case argument for theism similar to that which Swinburne offers. His book will appeal to theists who recognize that religious experience provides a more compelling argument for a personal God than the typical arguments from features of the world's design, including fine tuning. Whether he can move naturalists from their secular perches is unclear. In his chapter on religious experience, and in several other places, he makes brief references to spirits that are possibly finite, not just to the infinite being featured in Judaeo-Christian-Islamic religion, who is also said to be Spirit. Finite spirits strike me as comprising the ontological order that is best capable of demolishing naturalism, and I applaud Kwan for mentioning them in his book.

Kwan's work is very clearly laid out, closely argued, and a fine contribution to a form of philosophy whose value he initially doubted.