The Rationality of Perception

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Susanna Siegel, The Rationality of Perception, Oxford University Press, 2017, 240pp., $55.00, ISBN 9780198797081.

Reviewed by Dustin Stokes, University of Utah


Suppose you are about to give a talk at some important venue. You are presenting a paper that is well polished, and about which you feel enthusiastic. Nonetheless, you suffer anxiety before the event. Just before the presentation you remind yourself to be confident; and as you catch an exceptionally furrowed brow while scanning the room, you remind yourself that philosophers rarely smile at talks. But as the talk goes on, these self-reminders are no use: seeing the faces and body language of the audience, your sense increases that they are confused or bored or frustrated. By the end, you conclude that you’ve botched the talk. You could just see, as we say, the negative responses in the audience.

But then you receive the counterevidence. The questions during the Q&A are encouraging, critical and probing. At dinner that evening you query your hosts about the talk. And while they are your hosts, you can spot a lie, and their responses are uniformly positive. And so this is the rub. On the one hand, you have several firsthand reports that the talk went well. And antecedently, you felt positive about it. But you also felt anxious, and that anxiety seemed to take hold once the talk began. And so, on the other hand, you experienced — seemed to see with your own eyes! — that the talk went badly. Applying the former evidence might reasonably lead you to conclude that you are hyper-analyzing things, and that your anxiety clearly influenced how you perceived the situation. So, you should not believe your eyes. But that is a hard pill to swallow: it is natural (and usually reliable) to believe your own eyes.

Many readers will recognize that the case is described as if it takes a certain structure, where something non-perceptual — in this case, anxiety — influences one’s perceptual experience of the world — in this case, vision. But this description begs important questions central to current debates in philosophy of perception and cognitive science. Those debates center around a variety of mental phenomena, many of them experimentally tested, and what kind of cognitive architecture best explains them. Some argue that an evidenced phenomenon is best explained as one where an antecedent belief, desire, intention, emotional state, or some other non-perceptual process influences, in some relatively direct and important way, perceptual experience. Some call this a top-down effect on perception, others the cognitive penetration of perceptual experience. But alternative explanations, sometimes driven by opposing cognitive architectures, are available. In the above case, perhaps your visual experiences of the audience were no different (phenomenologically; representationally) than those of some non-anxious counterpart. But the judgments you made or beliefs formed on the basis of what you see are influenced by that anxiety.

What is crucial here is that what you should do — should you believe your eyes, or not? — depends on what the correct cognitive architecture is. The ‘should’ here carries normative, epistemic force: Is it rational to believe your eyes in cases like these? But the prescription is also tethered to facts, whatever they should turn out to be, about how the mind is structured: Was your vision really affected?

Susanna Siegel’s book is centered around the problem of hijacked experience. This problem takes the form of the anxious talk example, where a case of this sort is interpreted such that the prior outlook, in this case anxiety directed towards a particular kind of social environment, “reaches all the way down to a visual experience” (6). Siegel characterizes this as a philosophical problem, involving the same tension, “the pressure to say that it is rational for [the agent] to believe their eyes, and the pressure to say that it isn’t” (6). She acknowledges that whether this interpretation tracks actual facts about human minds “is a question for Psychology” (4). However, Siegel proposes to solve the problem, thus construed, by arguing that perceptual experience can result from a rationally evaluable etiology and, second, that perceptual experience itself can be rationally evaluable. Perception thus can be, in a deep sense, rational. A worry, developed below, concerns how this mere possibility comports with actual facts about the human mind, or with our best empirically informed research and, consequently, how or whether that mere possibility issues in genuine epistemic prescriptions.

Siegel’s argument for the rationality of perception proceeds by what she sometimes calls a “constructive defense” and elsewhere a “proof of concept”. The claim is that perceptual experience is rational (or “reasonable”) not in the more specialized sense that it involves, or results from, conscious deliberation, but in the broad sense that the etiological route to that experience is rationally appraisable and, thereby, the experience itself can be “evaluable as rationally better or worse” (18). Inference thus provides an important model for Siegel’s account of perception: when the inputs to inference are good, and the inferential structure sound, then beliefs in response to that inference are rational. Accordingly, “If perceptual experiences can arise from inference, then the Rationality of Perception is true” (19).

Siegel analyzes inference as a mental process, one involving a response to some informational state (a belief, a supposition, an experience) that results in a conclusion. She argues against the more traditional model that would add to this characterization that drawing an inference involves “reckoning”: identifying some kind of support relation between the informational state and the conclusion drawn (Chapter 5). The claim is not that reckoning is not inferring, but that there are paradigmatic cases of inference that do not involve reckoning. The argument is straightforward and proceeds by identifying plausible cases of inference (for instance, categorizing someone as being kind), where one could achieve the relevant response to the relevant informational state(s) but without being able to identify the epistemic support relation that moves from the informational state to the conclusion. If the argument succeeds, this opens up conceptual space for perceptual experiences being the mental response to an inference. Accordingly, a central feature of the book is then to extend this model of inference to perception, and provide an account of the implications for the epistemic valence of inferentially modulated perceptual experiences (Chapters 6 & 7).

There are a number of other contributions worthy of note. First, Siegel takes on important questions about the nature of perception, as one would expect given any knowledge of her previous important work in this area. In addition to the possible inferential nature of perceptual etiology, Chapter 8 gives accounts of a number of possible non-doxastic effects on perception, from desires and motivational states, to the emotional dispositions that attach to acrophobia. Chapter 9 discusses the effects of selective attention on perception, framed again in terms of Siegel’s inferential model. And Chapter 10 provides a novel account of the possibility of implicit biases and prejudices being, in some cases, perceptual phenomena.

Another contribution is terminological: Siegel eschews relying on many of the entrenched terms of contemporary epistemology, and introduces a rich array of new terminology. A central example is the notion of “epistemic charge” (Chapter 3). “By virtue of being epistemically charged, a mental state redounds well or badly to the subject. In this way, epistemically charged mental states manifest an epistemic status” (25). Siegel does not intend the notion of charge to reduce to epistemological notions like justification or ill- vs. well-formedness (even if she employs these more familiar terms to partly explain the new notion). Thus, epistemic charge is not just a property possessed by experiences in relation to resultant beliefs; it is not, as some theorize things, just a justification-conferring feature. Instead, it is supposed to be an epistemic status that experiences have “in themselves” and that can be passed to subsequent mental states like belief and modulated by the (inferential) etiology of the experience. As the electricity metaphor would suggest, then, epistemic charge is a positively or negatively valenced property that can be transmitted across mental states and processes.

If experiences are charged in this way then, like beliefs and acts of reasoning, they contribute to the all-things-considered rational status of the agent. Accordingly, the other component of Siegel’s overall argument for the rationality of perception — combined with the account of inference and inferentially modulated experience — concludes that experiences can be epistemically charged. Here again by appeal to examples, Siegel argues that there are no formidable, principled reasons to deny that experiences could have this epistemic property.

Whether experiences are charged in this way, and whether they do involve inference, are matters concerning the actual nature of perceptual experience, not matters determined by how experience merely could be. And so the degree to which these are lasting contributions to an epistemology of perception might be questioned along the following lines. Metaphysics regularly trades in mere possibilities, and across a range of modalities from the conceptual to the nomological. Assuming that epistemology is still in part a normative discipline, the range of relevant modalities is more constrained. Put simply, if a theory is going to yield epistemic prescriptions about what mental acts we ought to perform, and what counts as rational behavior, for us, then the theory should be grounded in what is nomologically possible for us and, ideally, what is actual for us. Hume’s dictum, in some form, applies no less to epistemic prescriptions than moral ones.

As noted above, there is ongoing controversy about whether and how non-perceptual processes might affect perceptual experience. A number of recent theorists, philosophers and psychologists both, have argued that perception is affected in relevant ways. One would expect a great deal of this literature to provide Siegel with ready allies. But in many cases, that research is simply not consulted. To offer just a few examples: On the rational evaluability of mental states (Nolfi 2015); on the effect of motivational and other non-doxastic states on perception (Balcetis and Dunning 2010; Stokes 2012; Wu 2013; Balcetis 2016); on the effect of acrophobia and fear on perception (Stefanucci et al. 2008; Stefanucci and Proffitt 2009); on evaluative perception (Stokes 2014; Nanay 2016; Bergvist and Cowan, forthcoming); on attention and cognitive penetrability of perception (Mole 2015; Wu 2017); and on the nature of implicit biases as mental phenomena (Brownstein and Saul 2016). For each of these accounts, there are veritable critics. But importantly, each account provides empirically informed arguments.

Other research is consulted, but the details of the relevant arguments or experiments are largely set to one side, with the interpretation that is needed for the proposed epistemology sometimes explicitly assumed. For example, with regard to a now well-known set of experiments on colour perception (beginning with Hansen et al. 2006), Siegel writes:

Many researchers claim that the results show that stored information influences perceptual experience, though some argue that it only influences judgment. I’m going to assume that it influences perceptual experience, so that we can explore the idea that those experiences result from an inference from stored information. (101)

To be fair, Siegel is often clear about her reasons for making these assumptions. The central interest of the book is the epistemology of perception, and whether it is, or can be, rational in some substantial sense.

But in this light, it is difficult to see how the proof of concept approach gets any real traction. The conceptual or metaphysical possibility of creatures with perceptual systems that are inferentially modulated or regularly influenced in top-down ways is not one in need of proving. Surely there are possible worlds where perceptual experience is pervasively cognitively penetrated (or robustly inferential). That debate (and related debates) is not a conceptual or metaphysical one. Nor does it seem that this is the possibility that Siegel needs. What the epistemology is grounded on, what it must be grounded on if it is to have any normative application to our epistemic practices, is the nomological possibility — really, the actuality — of inferentially modulated, non-perceptually influenced perceptual experience.

Siegel is correct: humans could have perceptual systems that sometimes process information in a way that takes the structure given by her constructive defense. Humans could be that way. And if we could, or if we do, have this kind of cognitive architecture, then Siegel has provided a rich epistemological story about how we might reconceive of ourselves as rational agents in the world. The foundational question for a theory of the rationality of perception, though, is whether we do have such cognitive architectures. The question is are we that way? And if the answer turns out to be ‘no’, or if no substantive, empirically grounded argument is given to show that the answer is ‘yes’, then the offered proof of concept is part of an epistemological story, but no story about the rationality of human perception.


Many thanks to Steve Downes, Anya Farennikova, Mohan Matthen, Bence Nanay, Kate Nolfi, and Jonna Vance for discussion of these ideas and/or an earlier draft.


Balcetis, E., and Dunning, D. 2010. “Wishful seeing: Desired objects are seen as closer” Psychological Science 21: 147-152.

Balcetis, E. 2016. “Approach and Avoidance as Organizing Structures for Motivated Distance Perception” Emotion Review 8 (2):115-128.

Bergqvist, A. and Cowan, R. (forthcoming) Evaluative Perception. Oxford University Press.

Brownstein, M. and Saul, J. 2016. Implicit Bias and Philosophy: Volume 1: Metaphysics and Epistemology. Oxford University Press.

Hansen, T., M. Olkkonen, S. Walter and K.R. Gegenfurtner. 2006. “Memory modulates color appearance.” Nature Neuroscience 9: 1367-8.

Mole, C. 2015. “Attention and Cognitive Penetration” in J. Zeimbekis and A. Raftopoulos (eds.), The Cognitive Penetrability of Perception. Oxford University Press.

Nanay, B. 2016. Aesthetics as Philosophy of Perception. Oxford University Press.

Nolfi, K. 2015. “Which mental states are rationally evaluable, and why?” Philosophical Issues 25(1): 41-63.

Stefanucci, J., Proffitt, D., Clore, G., Parekh, N. 2008. “Skating down a steeper slope: Fear influences the perception of geographical slant” Perception 37(2): 321-3.

Stefanucci, J. and Proffitt, D. 2009. “The roles of altitude and fear in the perception of height” J of Exper Psych: Human Perception and Performance 35(2): 424.

Stokes, D. 2012. “Perceiving and Desiring: A New Look at the Cognitive Penetrability of Experience” Philosophical Studies 158 (3):479-92.

____2014. “Cognitive penetration and the perception of art.”Dialectica 68(1): 1-34.

Wu, W. 2013. “Visual spatial constancy and modularity: Does intention penetrate vision?” Philosophical Studies 165(2): 647-669.

____ 2017. “Shaking Up the Mind’s Ground Floor: The Cognitive Penetration of Visual Attention” Journal of Philosophy 114 (1):5-32.