The Really Hard Problem: Meaning in a Material World

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Owen Flanagan, The Really Hard Problem: Meaning in a Material World, MIT Press, 2007, 288pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780262062640.

Reviewed by Peter B. M. Vranas, University of Wisconsin-Madison


The primary objective of this book is to promote what Flanagan calls eudaimonistic scientia, or eudaimonics for short, namely the "empirical-normative inquiry into the nature, causes, and conditions of human flourishing" (p. 1). A secondary objective of the book is to show that eudaimonics can be pursued while adhering to naturalism, which Flanagan understands as reining in "temptations to revert to dualistic and/or supernaturalistic ways of speaking and thinking about human nature" (p. 3). Another secondary objective is to reconcile spirituality, which according to Flanagan contributes to human flourishing, with science, which according to Flanagan motivates naturalism. A third secondary objective is to show that one norm "that eudaimonics favors is that we ought to seek to flourish with the truth by our side" (p. 108), avoiding superstition and wishful thinking. And a fourth secondary objective is to defend eudaimonics against objections, including (1) the objection that eudaimonics tries to derive norms from facts and thus founders on the is/ought thesis, and (2) the "internalist objection" that eudaimonics cannot adjudicate between competing conceptions of human flourishing corresponding to different cultures. In what follows I examine some of the above objectives in more detail.

What are, according to Flanagan, the "nature, causes, and conditions of human flourishing"? I find it hard to answer this question, for two reasons. The first reason is that Flanagan uses a variety of terms apparently related to "human flourishing": he talks about "happiness" (p. 1), "well-being" (p. 50), "a good human life" (p. 38), "excellent human lives" (p. 167), "truly rich and meaningful lives" (p. 167), and "a life that really matters, that makes a positive and lasting contribution" (p. 1). With the exception of "happiness", which Flanagan tentatively sets apart (p. 245, n. 13), it is not clear whether Flanagan takes the above terms to be roughly synonymous; to make headway, I will assume that he does. The second reason is that what seem to be parts of the answer to the above question are scattered over the book; nowhere did I find a comprehensive summary. For example, concerning necessary or sufficient conditions for human flourishing (or for living meaningfully, and so on), Flanagan makes at least three kinds of claims. First, Flanagan says that "recent work in the field [of positive psychology] claims a comparative consensus on the virtues that are mandatory for eudaimonia" (p. 50): justice, humaneness, temperance, wisdom, transcendence, and courage. Second, Flanagan says that flourishing "can't be achieved unless fitness is" (p. 55), and seems to take the fulfillment of certain basic needs like "food, water, shelter, and sex" (p. 54) to be necessary for achieving fitness. Third, Flanagan says:

Meaningful human lives … involve being moral, having true friends, and having opportunities to express our talents, to find meaningful work, to create and live among beautiful things, and to live cooperatively in social environments where we trust each other. If we have all these things, then we live meaningfully by any reasonable standard. If we have only some of them, we live less meaningfully, and if we lack all these things, especially the first two, our life is meaningless. (p. 58)

It is not clear whether the claim that the virtues of wisdom and courage are necessary for flourishing is compatible with the claim that being moral, in conjunction with having true friends and so on, is sufficient for living meaningfully: why can't those who are not wise or courageous (but are not foolish or cowardly either) still be moral, have true friends, and so on? Similarly, it seems that lack of fitness makes being moral etc. hard but not impossible. Another worry is that, according to a standard that Flanagan mentions, being moral, in conjunction with having true friends and so on, is not sufficient for living meaningfully. This is the standard of making "a positive and lasting contribution" (p. 1): if my friends, family, and students (and their descendants) die and my work is irreversibly destroyed at the time of my death, I make no lasting contribution. Yet another worry is that arguably having true friends and living cooperatively are not necessary for living meaningfully: a hermit who proves what are, unbeknown to her, important mathematical conjectures can make a positive and lasting contribution (suppose her notes are found after her lonely death). The above worries are addressed in a large philosophical literature; oddly enough, Flanagan fails to engage with that literature.

Flanagan's attempt to reconcile spirituality with science takes up two of the six chapters of the book: chapters 3 and 6. In chapter 3, Flanagan goes over Buddhism in some detail, and argues that Buddhists need not reject the theory of evolution or contemporary mind science. In chapter 6, Flanagan distinguishes between assertive theists, who assert certain "propositions about the existence and nature of God or gods" (p. 189), and expressive theists, who express such propositions without asserting them. An expressive theist conceives of a creation story as a myth, so "it is not a criticism that … [the story] is resistant to all forms of naturalistic confirmation or disconfirmation" (p. 192). Flanagan's claim that expressive theism is compatible with science seems correct, but I suspect that most traditional theists will not find this kind of reconciliation satisfactory.

According to Flanagan, "Western epistemology is built around the idea that we ought not have false beliefs", and "Buddhism and Confucianism say pretty much the same" (p. 168). But Flanagan worries that his claim that eudaimonics favors the norm "that we ought to seek to flourish with the truth by our side" (p. 108) is subject to the objection that certain false beliefs which psychologists call "positive illusions" "causally" (p. 168) "contribute to happiness, well-being, optimism, and so on" (p. 169). In response to this objection, Flanagan makes certain comments intended to cast doubt on the claim that the psychological research findings on positive illusions show that people have false beliefs. For example, in response to the finding that "[t]hings persons do poorly are judged less important than things at which they are accomplished" (p. 173), Flanagan comments that such judgments do not show that people are making mistakes, "in part because there is no objective fact of the matter about how important it is for each individual" to have a certain skill (p. 173). Flanagan's comments may be satisfactory as far as they go, but they fail to address some other psychological findings that Flanagan mentions. For example: "Favored abilities are seen as rare. Disabilities are seen as common"; "People think they have improved in abilities that are important to them even when their performance has remained unchanged"; and so on (p. 173). Moreover, in claiming that "nothing warrants the global conclusion that all persons at all times are destined to harbor false, self-serving, positive illusions about themselves" (p. 176), Flanagan seems to be attacking a straw man: I know of no psychologist who claims that all persons at all times are destined to harbor false positive illusions about themselves. Similarly, although one can hardly find fault with Flanagan's conclusion that "[s]ince there are some individuals in every group who do not suffer from the alleged illusions, positive illusions are not essential components of mental health or happiness … if 'essential' is taken to mean 'necessary'" (p. 180), this conclusion does not address the objection that positive illusions causally contribute to happiness, the causal link being understood probabilistically, like the link between smoking and lung cancer.

In response to the objection that eudaimonics tries to derive norms from facts and thus founders on the is/ought thesis, Flanagan makes two main points. First, eudaimonics does not use deductive logic, so it does not try to derive norms from facts (p. 121). Second, there are "sciences, such as medicine and (more recently) psychiatry, clinical psychology, and social work, that incorporate norms" (p. 108), so eudaimonics can be "thoroughly empirical" (p. 110) if these sciences are. In response to the "internalist objection" that eudaimonics cannot adjudicate between competing conceptions of human flourishing corresponding to different cultures, Flanagan argues that the "strategy of seeking 'wider reflective equilibrium' can … be used in comparing [for example] Aristotle's conception of eudaimonia with the Buddhist conception" (p. 123). However, Flanagan "simply won't discuss the possibility that the views might be incomparable or incommensurable" (p. 123), so his discussion may be unsatisfactory to those who take this possibility seriously.

Flanagan thinks that eudaimonics should involve "not only all mind sciences and evolutionary biology but also Western and Eastern philosophy, political theory, the history of religion", positive psychology, "[a]nthropology, sociology, and economics" (p. xii); accordingly, the book is interdisciplinary. It covers several topics besides those I discussed above. The writing is in general clear and careful. The book seems to be targeted primarily at laypersons, but it may also be of interest to professional philosophers.