The Reasons of Love

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Frankfurt, Harry G., The Reasons of Love, Princeton, 2004, 110pp, $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 0691091641.

Reviewed by Philip L. Quinn, University of Notre Dame


This book is a revised version of material that Harry Frankfurt presented as the Romanell-Phi Beta Kappa Lectures in Philosophy at Princeton University in 2000 and as the Shearman Lectures at University College, London, in 2001. It rehearses and further elaborates on themes that have been prominent in Frankfurt’s published papers for more than three decades. On some topics, the book covers fewer details than do those papers. Hence reading it is not an adequate substitute for studying them carefully. The compensating benefit is that the book provides an overview that clarifies how the themes fit together. It is therefore a valuable supplement to the papers that cover the same ground.

It is also a pleasure to read. The book’s dust jacket claims that it is beautifully written. Its literary qualities seem to me to resemble the sharp lines and bright colors of a fine Mondrian or the austere elegance of good modernist architecture, not the rich chiaroscuro of a Titian or the exuberance of a baroque cathedral. Frankfurt’s prose will prove to be particularly attractive to those with the taste for desert landscapes whose cultivation is highly recommended in contemporary analytic philosophy.

Early in the book, Frankfurt expresses dissatisfaction with the limited conceptual resources deployed by philosophers and economists who study practical reasoning. He considers the ubiquitous notion of what people want or desire to be “heavily overburdened, and a bit limp” (10). One of the book’s central projects is to enrich our conceptual repertoire by articulating three additional notions. They are: “what we care about, what is important to us, and what we love” (11). The book’s first chapter, whose title is “The Question: ’How Should We Live?’,” develops his account of the concepts of care and importance. The second chapter, which is entitled “On Love, and Its Reasons,” focuses on the concept of love. And the third and final chapter, called “The Dear Self,” puts these concept to work in a subtle analysis and spirited defense of self-love.

Frankfurt motivates the first chapter’s discussion by drawing a distinction between merely desiring something and caring about it or regarding it as important to us. Many of our desires are inconsequential. We do not really care about those desires; satisfying them is of no importance to us. What is more, caring about something differs from taking it to be intrinsically valuable. When he wants an ice cream cone, Frankfurt tells us, he wants it simply for the pleasure of eating it. This does not imply that he cares about eating the ice cream or that the ice cream is important to him.

What does it mean, then, to care about something? At this point in the argument, Frankfurt appeals to the hierarchical picture of desires that plays a central role in his thought about moral psychology. He says: “By its very nature, caring manifests and depends upon our distinctive capacity to have thoughts, desires, and attitudes that are about our own attitudes, desires, and thoughts” (17). In short, we have the reflexive capacity to have desires regarding our own desires. We want some of them to move us to action and would prefer that others remain motivationally ineffective. In addition, we typically want some of our desires to persist and are indifferent or opposed to the persistence of others. According to Frankfurt, “these alternative possibilities--commitment to one’s own desires or an absence of commitment to them--define the difference between caring and not caring” (21). Whether one cares or does not care about the object of a desire depends upon which of these alternatives obtains.

How is what we care about related to what is important to us? At first glance, it may seem that importance is more fundamental. Frankfurt acknowledges that “many things are important to us despite the fact that we do not recognize that importance and therefore do not care at all about them” (21). Exposure to background radition is important to many people who have no idea that there is such a thing. For Frankfurt, however, bedrock is caring. He claims: “The things that are important to a person despite the fact that he does not actually care about them, or even know about them, can have that importance to him only in virtue of standing in a certain relationship to something that he does care about” (22). If there were a person who cared about nothing at all, nothing would be important to her. Hence, “it is by caring about things that we infuse the world with importance” (23). In other words, by caring we project importance onto the world. In Frankfurt’s opinion, our caring creates importance for us.

Moreover, we cannot find reasons to care about anything unless we already care about something. The question of how we should live thus cannot be, according to Frankfurt, the most basic question for us to raise concerning the conduct of our lives. For that normative question can only be answered on the basis of a prior answer to the factual question of what we actually care about. Fortunately, almost everybody does care about something. Indeed, humans care about many of the same things because human nature and the basic conditions of human life are not subject to much variation. At the deepest level of what we care about, Frankfurt thinks we cannot have reasons or proof that will provide complete justification for any way of life. But we do not need these things. His conclusion is this: “Coping with our troubled and restless uncertainty about how to live does not require us to discover what way of living can be justified by definitive argument. Rather, it requires us simply to understand what it is that we ourselves really care about, and to be decisively and robustly confident in caring about it” (28). All we really need, therefore, is the courage to be confident of the commitments that define for us what we actually care about or, at least, the deepest of these commitments.

At bottom, such commitments are not responses to commands of reason. As Frankfurt sees it, “the commands to which they do in fact respond are grounded in a source that is constituted not by judgments and reasons, but by a particular mode of caring about things” (29). They are, he says, commands of love. In the first chapter, he has not said much about love, merely remarking in passing that it is “an especially notable variant of caring” (11) or “a particular mode of caring” (31). The second chapter is devoted to elucidating Frankfurt’s distinctive conception of love.

Frankfurt wishes to sketch the contours of a concept of practical love that has less to do with feeling or belief than with “a configuration of the will that consists in a practical concern for what is good for the beloved” (43). Thus understood, love is not to be confused with infatuation, lust, obsession, possessiveness, or emotional dependency. Romantic and sexual relationships are not paradigms of love of this kind. Such love is not necessarily a response to the perceived value of the beloved, but the beloved does necessarily acquire value for us because we love it.

In his discussion, Frankfurt highlights four marks of love as he conceives it, describing them in the third chapter as conceptually necessary features. First, “love is, most centrally, a disinterested concern for the existence of what is loved, and for what is good for it” (42). The lover seeks the good of the beloved for its own sake, not merely for the sake of some ulterior purpose. Second, love is ineluctably particular. For someone concerned with no more than comforting the afflicted, any afflicted person will do. By contrast, there can be no substitute for the beloved. As Frankfurt puts it, “it cannot possibly be all the same to the lover whether he is devoting himself disinterestedly to what he actually does love or--no matter how similar it might be--to something else instead” (44). Third, the lover identifies with the beloved. He takes the interests of the beloved to be his own. Consequently, “the lover is invested in his beloved: he profits by its successes, and its failures cause him to suffer” (61). And fourth, love is not under our direct and immediate voluntary control. What we love is not simply a matter of choice or up to us. In loving, we are subject to some sort of volitional necessity that limits or constrains the will. However, according to Frankfurt, “it is by our own will, and not by any external or alien force, that we are constrained” (46).

Like other modes of caring, love is not dictated to us by reason. What we love is ultimately determined for us by biological and other natural conditions as well as by contingencies of character and experience. Our control over such circumstances is at best meager and indirect, yet the loves they produce set final ends for us. Thus, for Frankfurt, “we cannot help it that the direction of our practical reasoning is in fact governed by the specific final ends that our love has defined for us” (49). To be sure, there may be conflicts among the things we love, even unavoidable conflicts with tragic outcomes. But it may happen, if we are fortunate, that there is in fact no conflict among the motivations imposed on us by our loves. In that case, we have no basis within ourselves for uncertainty or reluctance, no grounds for hesitation or doubt, about acceding to the motivations to which our loves give rise. Then, Frankfurt urges, it cannot be improperly arbitrary for us to repose confidence in the responses of our own volitional character.

What we love is important to us, and so too is loving itself. As Frankfurt astutely observes, “besides the fact that my children are important to me for their own sakes, there is the additional fact that loving my children is important to me for its own sake” (51). He argues that the importance to us of having final ends helps to explain the importance of loving. We need to have final ends because without them our activity would have no real point. Loving satisfies this need by binding us to final ends by more than an adventitious impulse or a willful choice. Love is thus the originating source of terminal value. In Frankfurt’s view, “insofar as love is the creator both of inherent or terminal value and of importance, then, it is the ultimate ground of practical rationality” (56).

Frankfurt also touches on the risks of loving. In addition to the dangers of conflict among our loves already mentioned, he draws attention to the way in which our lack of immediate voluntary control over what we love renders us susceptible to being unwisely invested in love. He says: “Love may engage us in volitional commitments from which we are unable to withdraw and through which our interests may be severely harmed” (63). Yet the volitional constraint that exposes us to this peril itself contributes significantly to the value loving has for us. How is this possible?

Frankfurt’s answer to this question derives from what he takes to be an instructive analogy between reason and love. In the dynamics of both, an encounter with necessity liberates us from uncertainty. Citing Bertrand Russell’s allusion to the restfulness of mathematical certainty, Frankfurt contends that certainty grounded in necessary truths frees us from the struggle to make up our minds. It enables us to “give up the debilitating restraint that we impose upon ourselves when we are unsure what to think” (65). Consequently, “we are released from the blockage of irresolution and can give ourselves to an unimpeded assent” (65). Similarly, the volitional necessity of love puts an end to indecisiveness concerning what to care about. Frankfurt claims that “indifference and unsettled ambivalence, which may radically impair our capacity to choose and to act, are thereby overcome” (66). This resoluteness “helps to ensure that we neither flounder aimlessly nor hold ourselves back from definitive adherence to a meaningful practical course” (66).

Some of the language Frankfurt uses in developing this analogy strikes me as a bit over the top. Perhaps it reveals something about what is important to him by suggesting some dark fears. It is as if being Hamlet were his worst nightmare!

The second chapter concludes with the thought that people often try to see to it, to the extent that they can indirectly shape their loves, that the things they love are regarded by themselves and others as valuable. Your loves may be counted to your credit, or they may reflect badly on you. According to the conventional wisdom, self-love is hardly praiseworthy, though we may look on it indulgently if it is kept in check. The third chapter mounts a bracing challenge to the conventional wisdom’s disdain for love of oneself.

Kant serves as the foil for Frankfurt’s account of self-love. After outlining Kant’s discussion in the Grundlegung of how the dear self subverts the motivation required by morality, Frankfurt acknowledges that “there is something appealingly poignant and rather sweet in his sorrowful allusions to the inherent frailties of human character and to the anxious maneuvers of self-deception in which we attempt to conceal them” (77). However, he judges that, as Kant portrays it, the dear self craves that it be indulged, not that it be truly loved in his sense. By contrast, given Frankfurt’s characterization of love, self-love turns out to be a love of unalloyed purity. It disinterestedly seeks the good of the beloved for its own sake and is ineluctably particular. Self-love’s identification with the beloved is especially robust because the interests of lover and beloved are literally identical, and it not only escapes immediate voluntary control but it is also exceptionally difficult to elude even by indirect means. Frankfurt makes the interesting suggestion that the love parents ordinarily have for their small children is comparable, though not equal, in purity. He claims: “Parents generally care about the good of their small children in a way that is exclusively noninstrumental. They value it only for its own sake” (83).

What, then, are the distinctive features of love of oneself? According to Frankfurt, “the most perspicuous characterization of the essential nature of self-love is simply that someone who loves himself displays and demonstrates that love just by loving what he loves” (85). So self-love is not to be equated with selfishness. For Frankfurt, this love is normally derivative from the love that people have for things other than themselves. However, love of oneself, thus conceived, may seem to be nothing more than “a mere redundancy, generated by a rather pointless iteration” (86). Self-love may appear to collapse into simple love of the things one loves.

The appearance of collapse can be dispelled, Frankfurt maintains, if we attend to complexities of two kinds. The first is the possibility that someone may love herself even though she does not love anything else. Here the comparison with parental love proves to be illuminating. As Frankfurt points out, parents may manifest love by trying to see to it that their young children come to have genuine interests or things they really care about. He therefore recognizes a rudimentary kind of self-love that “consists in a person’s desire to have goals that he must accept as his own and to which he is devoted for their own sakes rather than merely for their instrumental value” (90). In other words, this elementary form of love of oneself is a simple desire to love. If we cannot help having this desire, we are naturally framed to love loving.

The second sort of complexity arises from the perplexing fact that people sometimes are divided within themselves about what they love. Thus it may happen that a person loves something and, at the same time, does not want to love it. Since Frankfurt takes uncertainty and irresolution to be especially perturbing, as we have already seen, it is to be expected that he will be seriously concerned about this kind of volitional ambivalence. And so he is. If the ambivalence cannot be resolved by a decisive identification with one side of the conflict, the person is volitionally fragmented. Frankfurt describes the state of such a person in this way: “His will is unstable and incoherent, moving him in contrary directions simultaneously or in a disorderly sequence. He suffers from a radically entrenched ambivalence, in which his will remains obstinately undefined and therefore lacks effective guiding authority” (92). The person is at odds with himself as long as he is torn by such a conflict.

The problem of ambivalence is, of course, an old problem. A well known passage from Augustine’s Confessions that Frankfurt quotes provides an example from late antiquity. Though he does not do so, perhaps because it would introduce additional complications, he might also have cited the earlier example of Paul’s complaint about the law of his members being at war with the law of his mind. Paul and Augustine view the divided will as a disease from which humans are prone to suffer as a consequence of ancestral corruption.

According to Frankfurt, if ambivalence is a disease, the health of the mind demands a unified will. To have an undivided will is to be wholehearted. And, in turn, “to be wholehearted is to love oneself” (95). Why should this be important to us? Frankfurt offers two reasons. First, divided wills are self-defeating because division of the will is the volitional counterpart of self-contradiction in thought. And second, possessing the inner harmony of an undivided will is tantamount to having freedom of a fundamental kind, freedom from obstruction from within oneself. He concludes: “Self-love has going for it, then, its role in constituting both the structure of volitional rationality and the mode of freedom that this structure of the will ensures” (97). To be sure, wholeheartedness is compatible with loving horrendously bad things and so leading a thoroughly wicked life. Nevertheless, Frankfurt considers it very valuable. Though it is difficult to come by, it is a source of great satisfaction to those who possess it because it bestows meaning on their lives by giving them settled final ends.

At the conclusion of the book, Frankfurt records his suspicion that whether one achieves wholeheartedness depends heavily on luck. So suppose that, at the end of the day, you fail to do so and find you cannot love yourself. What should you do then? His advice is that you should “at least be sure to hang on to your sense of humor” (100). Maybe some of the characters that are Woody Allen’s stock in trade both need and heed this advice.

I have devoted a good deal of space to summarizing the views expressed in this book in order to convey to my readers a sense of how attractive they are. Frankfurt has thought long and hard about the issues he addresses. He gives ingenious and original arguments. And he states his position with precision and clarity. As a result, the book is very well suited to serve as a stimulus for further reflection and debate.

Some of this debate might with profit focus on points of detail. Consider, for example, Frankfurt’s claim that parents generally care about the good of their small children exclusively for its own sake. I suspect that such wholly noninstrumental parental care is common only in societies in which people need not regard themselves as destined to be dependent on their children in old age. In contemporary American society, many of us have incentives and opportunities to save resources that will allow us to remain independent of our children when we are old, and there is a social safety net to serve as backup if we are unlucky or improvident. We tend to worry about not being a burden on our children in old age because it is feasible for us to avoid this condition. In societies in which this is not the case, it would be surprising if parents did not care about the good of their small children for the sake of what their children are expected to do for them, when they can no longer live without assistance, as well as for its own sake. So I am inclined to think that wholly noninstrumental parental caring is restricted to people in fortunate social circumstances rather than being general. The dispute here, of course, concerns a factual point, and so empirical evidence would be required to resolve it.

To my mind, however, the most interesting problem raised by the book concerns Frankfurt’s appeal to care and love as remedies for conflicted states of the self. In my summary, I have emphasized his worries about restlessness, uncertainty, indecisiveness, irresolution, ambivalence, fragmentation, instability, disorder, and similar psychic conditions. He seems to be greatly troubled by such volitional perturbations, though I hope I have not exaggerated this preoccupation by singling it out for attention in my account of his position. But he does seem to cherish such things harmony, unity, clarity, stability, and repose. In other words, I see in his view a strong preference--reflected in his rhetoric more than in the content of any one statement--for what we might think of as Classical (as opposed to Romantic) virtues.

No doubt prolonged irresolution sometimes leads to volitional paralysis that can be harmful. Romantic Sturm und Drang can be carried to excess. Yet I tend to think that our lives would be impoverished if we did not allow room in them for a measure of restless striving toward a kind of self-transcendence that is bound to put the unity of the self at risk. It strikes me as a happy circumstance that sometimes, as Robert Browning put it, our reach should exceed our grasp. What is more, many of us confront a landscape of values in which there is irreducible plurality and at least occasional conflict. We find ourselves caring about and conferring importance on things that may even be incommensurable in value. Unless the conflict is a matter of logical necessity, in which case our commitments are guaranteed to be self-defeating, perhaps our best shot at flourishing involves learning to live with conflict, even if the price to be paid is some ambivalence about our commitments. In short, maybe our aim should be successful management of internal volitional conflict, not elimination of such conflict for the sake of having a unified and harmonious volitional character. Considerations such as these lead me to suspect that Frankfurt’s picture of how human lives can be rendered meaningful is too simple and one-sided.

To get down to some specifics, let me return to the case of Augustine. He was afflicted with a divided will near the climax of a spiritual crisis. However, the crisis was successfully resolved, and his subsequent life was rich in meaningful work. It seems clear that his later creativity was, at least in part, a result of his having passed through this spiritual crisis. So it may be that experiences of internal division are instrumentally good provided they are only episodic. Indeed, lives that are organically unified and good on the whole for those who live them might contain as bad parts episodes of internal division whose badness makes them better than they would be if those bad parts were replaced by their neutral negations. As Roderick Chisholm once suggested in a discussion of the concept of defeat, in that case those who live such lives should say: “Thank goodness for the badness of the parts that are bad!”

Augustine helps us to raise another deep question about the will. At the beginning of his spiritual autobiography, he famously addresses to God the remark that “our heart is restless until it rests in you” (Confessions 1.1). Frankfurt observes in a footnote that humans may be “constituted to love loving” (90). Augustine’s remark suggests that we are constituted to love something that transcends all finite goods such as our children, our friends, and various human ideals. If this suggestion is correct, we will never achieve complete satisfaction if we love only such limited goods. No matter how wholehearted we may become in loving such things for their own sake, our hearts will never be free from residual restlessness and ambivalence. In this way, the human will may bear an imprint that is a trace of its transcendent source.

I recommend this book very highly to anyone who is interested in moral psychology. It is a comprehensive statement of the mature views of one of the most creative philosophers of his generation. It is likely to provoke fruitful discussion. People outside the rather narrow circle of academic philosophers will find it accessible. It deserves to be widely read.