The Reception of Aristotle's Ethics

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Jon Miller (ed.), The Reception of Aristotle's Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 319pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521513883.

Reviewed by Pavlos Kontos, University of Patras


This is an important collection which addresses issues regarding the history and assessment of the influence of Aristotle's ethics -- and, in particular, his Nicomachean Ethics (NE) -- from ancient times to the near present. The fact that no single person is likely to possess that body of knowledge testifies, by itself, to the usefulness of the volume.

The collection offers as complete a history of the reception of Aristotle's ethics as possible, and its comprehensiveness distinguishes it from similar attempts aiming at different objectives.[1] The thirteen papers vary largely in their perspectives. They either exploit historical data about the availability of the original texts and the circulation of translations and commentaries or draw on the ways in which Aristotle's heirs re-appropriate his views. The diversity is not detrimental to the coherence of the whole but rather pleasurable to the reader and, as Jon Miller's short introduction explains, inevitable.[2]

Apart from its richness, the volume's most important contribution lies in helping us to realize that our own understanding of Aristotle's ethics is inescapably subject to 'reception history' (Rezeptionsgeschichte). Such an awareness should lead us: first, to relinquish the myth of an alleged prejudice-free and 'authentic' interpretation of Aristotle's texts and, second, to be more attentive to and respectful of the past, as many current ostensibly 'original' interpretations often prove to replicate or to be profoundly obliged to older ones, more or less influential in their times, which have just fallen into oblivion.

The two first chapters are among the highlights of the volume. "The NE in Hellenistic philosophy: a hidden treasure?" by Karen Margrethe Nielsen and "The transformation of Aristotle's ethics in Roman Philosophy" by Christopher Gill complement each other since they present opposing images of Aristotle's reception. Nielsen focuses on historical evidence and the hypothesis that, according to the story narrated by Plutarch and Strabo, Aristotle's esoteric works were not at the disposal of Athenian philosophers after the death of Theophrastus, since they were transferred to Scepsis, a Greek settlement in Asia Minor. Nielsen raises a number of questions to undermine the reliability of the story. She also takes a stance on the old dispute about whether Stoic theories are best explained as developments of Aristotle's ethics. Her considered view is that, at least partially, Stoic ideas are shaped by an Aristotelian influence. Inversely, in his highly dense essay, Gill demonstrates that the interpretations and commentaries of Aristotle's ethics in Greco-Roman intellectual life of the late Roman Republic, whether they had a critical character or not, were formulated in light of Hellenistic and post-Hellenistic debates and, more specifically, according to an agenda set by Stoic ideas. At this time, Stoic ideas shape the way one reads Aristotle. Three specific topics are telling in that regard: emotions, the development as oikeiôsis, and happiness. This also holds true for commentators with scholarly intentions, for example, Aspasius' reading of the role of emotions in Aristotle's ethics purports to adjust Aristotle's 'orthodox' notions in reaction against Stoic ideas.

Dominic J. O'Meara, in "Aristotelian Ethics in Plotinus", is also sensitive to questions of Rezeptionsgeschichte. While the issue of whether Plotinus had read the NE or Aristotle's commentators remains open, O'Meara nicely and carefully points out the principles the two philosophers share: the goal of human life, the criteria for happiness, the role of different types of virtue, and what he calls the gradational approach to virtue and happiness (see: Enneads 1.2 and 1.3). What matters is that Plotinus offers a coherent and enlightening reconstruction of certain claims in the NE that contemporary scholarship can hardly reconcile and, more significantly from the perspective of Rezeptionsgeschichte, that Greek commentators on the NE -- like Michael of Ephesus -- found in Plotinus interpretative clues to decode Aristotle's text.

In "St. Augustine's appropriation and transformation of Aristotelian eudaimonia", Michael W. Tkacz argues that it seems almost certain that Augustine knew Aristotle's ethics through Cicero' Hortensius, that is, Cicero's Protrepticus, so to speak. The exhortation to philosophy and contemplative happiness passes on to Augustine and shapes his devotion to philosophy. His texts Contra Academicos and De beata vita testify to this. Evidently Augustine's conception of contemplation departs from Aristotle's notion in that divine authority and a theistic God impose a supreme measure according to which eudaimonia is no longer circumscribed by philosophy alone. Tkacz aptly explains that it is in Augustine's appropriation of Aristotle's ethics that we can trace the passage from Greek eudaimonia to Christian divine grace.

Anna Akasoy makes an admirable effort to provide us with a brief but lucid and comprehensive survey of the "Arabic and Islamic reception of the Nicomachean Ethics".  The main pieces she uses to solve the puzzle of the non-influence of the NE in the Islamic-Arabic world include names and dates, details about the manuscripts available and the translations circulating at that time, and clarifications of why the Arabic tradition takes the NE to include eleven or twelve books. Apart from covering a wide range of topics, Akasoy shows how conscientiously Arabic thinkers coped with the challenges of translating Aristotle's text, which they read not in its original Greek but in intermediate Syriac or Arabic translations.

In "Maimonides' appropriation of Aristotle's ethics" -- among the strong contributions to the volume -- Kenneth Seeskin confronts a challenge of a different sort: how Maimonides integrates Aristotelian notions so as to reveal the original and true message of his religion. Seeskin nicely elucidates the transformation of the notions of the mean and of contemplative life in Chapters of the FathersLaws of Character Traits and The Guide for the Perplexed. In these works, Maimonides accommodates the theory of the mean to the excess inherent in the virtue of humility, and a defense of Jewish law to the demand for its rational grounding. Even though some of Seeskin's claims about Aristotle's ethics are disputable, he fully succeeds in expounding the adjustments Maimonides is compelled to make in both directions, i.e., by rationalizing Judaism and by giving a neo-platonic flavor to Aristotle's ethics.

Chapters 7-9 cover a very long period of some five centuries, that is, from Robert Grosseteste's translation and commentary of the NE in c. 1247 up to 1700. In "The relation of prudence and synderesis to happiness in the medieval commentaries on Aristotle's ethics", Anthony Celano structures his rich and lucid analysis -- his Gadamerian commitments put aside -- along two axes. One is a horizontal-historical axis that focuses on the figures of Philip the Chancellor, Albert the Great, and Thomas Aquinas. The other is a vertical-thematic axis that distinguishes and compares their tenets on two major issues. The first issue is the concept of synderesis that they insert in order to tackle the puzzles of phronêsis. The second is the much disputed issue of the connection between the practical realm and contemplation: do they represent two different spheres or two non-conflicting spheres; or are they rather connected in a means-end relation? It is astonishing to realize that these interpretations also dictate, in large part, the options envisaged by contemporary scholars.

Jack Zupko, in "Using Seneca to read Aristotle: the curious methods of Buridan's Ethics", nicely clarifies John Buridan's (c. 1300-61) commentary on the NE and detects the ways in which Seneca was regarded as perfecting Aristotle's ethics. What is crucial is that such an approach seemed to Buridan the best way to address Christian readers. Latin writers were even considered of higher importance than Aristotle some years later (see, for example, Petrarch). The argument was that they are better writers and better able to incite virtue, instead of just defining it.

In "Aristotle's Ethics in the Renaissance", David A. Lines provides us with an extremely nuanced view of the NE's reception during this period, from John Argyropoulos' translation into Latin in 1464 to the works by Jacques Lefèvre d'Etaples (second half of 15th century). Two things are particularly noteworthy at this juncture. First, the variety of genres through which the Ethics came to be analyzed and commented on -- compendia and handbooks, paraphrases and textbooks, and even dialogues -- served different purposes in different institutional and social contexts. Second, these works were being written not only in Latin but also in a variety of vernaculars.

"The end of ends? Aristotelian themes in early modern ethics" by Donald Rutherford, is among the highlights of the volume. Rutherford attempts to undermine or complicate the standard view according to which modern ethics is totally independent from and hostile to Aristotle's framework. Though he discusses Gassendi, Descartes, and Leibniz, he is primarily interested in Hobbes and Spinoza. The real challenge has been to identify Aristotelian themes in the latters' ethics, notwithstanding the fact that, on the one hand, Hobbes does not recognize any power of practical reason strictly speaking and, on the other, Spinoza endorses causal determinism. Rutherford argues that Hobbes' idea of a politically happy life integrates Aristotelian notions of happiness and virtue. Likewise, he sketches Spinoza's picture of the phenomenology of human action -- no matter whether our conception of ends is, in reality, a fiction -- as presupposing the acceptance of ends, at least because of our relative ignorance of the causal order. The conclusion of his argument is that we should not fall prey to the modern rhetoric of a totally new beginning in late 16th and 17th century philosophy. It is unclear however -- even though it does not compromise the strength of the argument -- whether Rutherford has in fact traced "the enduring influence of Aristotle" (p. 221) in modern ethics, or just the enduring influence of Ancient Greek eudaimonism in general.

In "Affective conflict and virtue: Hume's answer to Aristotle" Kate Abramson, unlike the other authors in the collection, does not address Aristotle's ethics. Instead, her main concern is to demonstrate the superiority of Hume's notion of virtue to the neo-Aristotelian views of Foot and Hursthouse (among others). Yet, needless to say, there is an abyssal gap between Aristotle's own framework and some instances of contemporary neo-Aristotelian ethics. Abramson intends to criticize the Aristotelian distinction between true virtue and mere continence in light of cases in which we seem to approve more of persons who act in the face of "temptation" than those who feel no temptation opposed to virtuous action. However, the framing of the initial hypothesis and the examples put in support of it prove to be inappropriate from an Aristotelian point of view since Aristotelian 'mere continence' presupposes that the object of 'temptation' has been already judged as being blameworthy in the particular circumstances of action. Notwithstanding Abramson's ingenious treatment of Hume's ethics, one thing seems certain: underlining that "matters should be settled in situ" or that "the overlapping spheres of interpersonal interaction" necessitate moral deliberation and that, in many cases, there might be "a justificatory basis" for favoritism (pp. 238-241) is obviously in continuity or, at any rate, not in rupture with Aristotle's ethics.

Manfred Kuehn's "Kant and Aristotle on ethics" also stands out from the other essays, in this case because of its strong polemical character. Kuehn argues that there are unbridgeable differences between Kant and Aristotle that render their projects largely incompatible. He defends his thesis against all those who have recently attempted to reduce the distance between the two ethical theories (Höffe is his main target). Kuehn is certainly right in maintaining that when we present an "Aristotelian Kant", we risk ignoring the way Kant himself wanted to be understood -- namely, as an enlightenment philosopher -- and that Kant's virtue ethics is substantially different from Aristotle's. But by overemphasizing these aspects, Kuehn is finally doing exactly what he blames his opponents for, since "it is possible to make any thing [not to] look like any other thing" (p. 261). I do not mean to deny that he draws a correct picture of Kant's own interpretation of Aristotle's ethics. But his conception of Rezeptionsgeschichte in the name of a certain Kantian purity is restrictive and unproductive -- it is telling that, by contrast, he welcomes the portrait of a "Kantian" Aristotle à la Nussbaum (p. 253, note 19). Additionally, Kuehn's picture of Aristotle's ethics is, to say the least, controversial. For example, he seems to not make room for phronêsis as an intellectual virtue and to downgrade the rationality of the virtue of character (see p. 247). That is why he does not see that by defining Kant's virtues as "mental principles", he is really arguing for and not against their affinity with Aristotle's conception of the virtues of character.

Jennifer Welchman ("The fall and rise of Aristotelian ethics in Anglo-American moral philosophy: nineteenth and twentieth centuries") incisively and with a fascinating irony narrates the story of the dismissal and rediscovery of Aristotle's ethics in the previous two centuries (from pre-Darwinian moral philosophy to the recent present). The conclusion of this final essay could serve as a comment on the whole volume: the prestige of the NE falls and rises according to the unpredictable effects of the predominant ideas, the leading philosophers, the standards of what counts as philosophy's method and purpose in general, and the status of academic institutions. That is to say, the reception of Aristotle's ethics does not admit of any sort of teleological explanations or anticipations.

My only reservation regarding the very presence of Welchman's final essay is that it should be accompanied by a twin essay telling the story of the equally fascinating and intriguing reception of Aristotle's ethics by Continental and, in particular, German philosophy in the twentieth century. By the way, this reception has been identified with the so-called "rehabilitation of moral philosophy".[3] I think this is a glaring omission that an eventual second edition should rectify.

On the whole, the volume constitutes a rich, handy and reliable guide, that is to say, an indispensable tool for everyone who is interested in the history of (Aristotle's) ethics.

[1] See, for instance, D. Lories & L. Rizzerio (eds.), Le jugement pratique. Autour de la notion de phronèsis, Vrin, Paris, 2008.

[2] The editor is, however, too eager to exculpate himself of any possible reproach -- for example, inconsistency in the transliteration of the Greek is, pace the editor's unconcern, an aesthetic and practical issue, all the more because of some lapsus, the most misleading of which is the writing 'syneisis' instead of 'syneidêsis' on p. 135.

[3] See the classic collection by M. Riedel (ed.), Rehabilitierung der Praktischen Philosophie, 2 v., Rombach Verlag, Freiburg i. Br., 1972/74.