The Reference Book

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John Hawthorne and David Manley, The Reference Book, Oxford University Press, 2012, 280pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199693672.

Reviewed by Barbara Abbott, Michigan State University


John Hawthorne and David Manley have two main objectives in this excellent book. The first is to demolish the common assumption, following Bertrand Russell, that some kind of acquaintance is required for both (singular) reference and singular thought. The second is to establish a semantic uniformity among four kinds of noun phrases (NPs) -- specific indefinite descriptions, definite descriptions, demonstratives, and proper names. There are two major proposals involved in this second task -- grouping specific indefinites with the other three categories, and analyzing all four as quantificational (and thus not prototypically referential, if referential at all). Although some of these ideas have been put forward by others (very generously cited in this book) the authors here do a thorough job of putting them together in a coherent way, and supplementing them with very detailed and exhaustive arguments.

Part I of this book is titled "Against acquaintance". The first, introductory, chapter, subtitled "Reference and singular thought", reviews Russell's views on reference and thought, and presents in summary form some characteristics surrounding these phenomena which are widely accepted today. Various types of acquaintance are considered and argued against, and the authors introduce and clarify their own view (especially in section 1.6, titled "Should auld acquaintance be forgot?") which they call "liberalism" -- the view that "there is no general acquaintance restriction on reference or singular thought" (p. 24). The chapter finishes with an outline of the remainder of the book.

Chapter 2, "A defense of liberalism", focuses on a principle the authors call "constraint" which says "To have a singular thought about an object, one must be acquainted with it" (p. 37). Two major arguments in favor of constraint are considered and dismantled. The first, which the authors call "The spy argument", rests on the intuitive distinction between (1) and (2).

(1) Ralph believes that at least one person is a spy.

(2) There is one person whom Ralph believes to be a spy.

Hawthorne and Manley argue that constraint is not necessary to explain this difference; all that is necessary is the fact that (2) attributes a singular belief to Ralph, which is more than (1) can satisfy.

The second argument the authors call "The Neptune argument". Recall that Urbain Le Verrier postulated the existence of a hitherto unknown planet to explain perturbations in the orbit of Uranus. Now suppose that Le Verrier had stipulated that this planet was to be named "Neptune". Then it seems that he could know that (3) was true,

(3) If a unique planet is the perturber, it is Neptune.

and thereby have a piece of singular knowledge. But surely this is wrong. After considering four replies to this argument that they deem insufficient, Hawthorne and Manley bring their own arguments to bear: e.g., that adding a causal relation between Le Verrier and Neptune (say by magically allowing his arm to extend into space to dub the planet), does nothing to mitigate the feeling that Le Verrier should not be able to achieve singular knowledge by stipulation.

The argument just considered addresses those for whom acquaintance must include some kind of causal relation. Chapter 3, "Epistemic acquaintance", addresses alternatives according to which acquaintance requires an ability to distinguish an object from others, or involves knowledge that the object exists. A major target of this chapter is a theory Gareth Evans put forward in The Varieties of Reference, which is of the first type -- i.e., involving discriminative ability, but the authors also raise several problems for the view that acquaintance requires knowledge of existence.

In Part II, "Beyond acquaintance", Hawthorne and Manley turn to issues of linguistic analysis. At fifty-eight pages, Chapter 4, "From the specific to the singular", is the longest chapter in the book. It is concerned with arguing that specific indefinite NPs are as referential as the other kinds of NPs usually assumed to be referential -- like demonstratives and proper names.[1] On this view, then, if a speaker notices that her friend Maria is absent and (intending to speak about Maria) asserts (4)

(4) A friend of mine is absent.

then the truth of what she says depends only on Maria's absence or presence. That is, (4) is false if Maria is in fact present while another friend of the speaker's is absent. (In this, the authors are following Schwarzschild 2002, as they note.) Hawthorne and Manley acknowledge differences of intuition about such examples, and certainly their case is stronger when certain is used, as in (5).

(5) A certain friend of mine is absent.

Still, there may be some hesitancy in accepting this crucial step.

If we accept Hawthorne and Manley's conclusions about the truth conditions of sentences containing specific indefinites, then the next step is to come up with a suitable analysis. As Janet Fodor and Ivan Sag have argued (1982), the specific readings of indefinite NPs cannot be satisfactorily accounted for with scope. This is because these readings occur in contexts viewed as scope islands, such as the antecedents of conditionals. Compare (6a) and (6b):

(6) a. If a certain friend of mine is absent, I'll never invite her again.

      b. If every friend of mine is absent, I'll never invite them again.

In (6a) the specific reading is certainly available, while (6b) cannot be heard as equivalent to (7):

(7) If any friend of mine is absent, I'll never invite them again.

(It should be noted that Fodor and Sag's claims here have been disputed -- e.g., by Ludlow and Neale 1991.)

Fodor and Sag concluded that indefinite NPs are ambiguous between a quantificational and a referential use, but Hawthorne and Manley raise several objections to that, most notably the fact that it has problems with "functional" specifics, as in (8).

(8) Every husband had forgotten a certain important date.

They develop instead an analysis (again following Schwarzchild 2002; cf. also Breheny 2008) on which indefinites are unambiguously quantificational. On this analysis, the difference between nonspecific and specific readings of indefinites turns on the presence of a particular kind of covert domain restriction -- material covertly predicated of the variable introduced by the existential quantifier which accompanies an indefinite. In the case of specific indefinites, there is a presupposition that the restriction narrows the domain to a single individual (in some cases, relative to items in the domain of a higher quantifier), and this is often accomplished by means of a condition of identity with the intended individual. (In the case of plurals like two friends of mine, used specifically, a single plurality is picked out.)

The postulation of this covert domain restriction raises an immediate issue about comprehension of utterances with specific indefinites. The domain restriction is said to be part of the semantics, and indeed part of the truth conditions of the utterance, and yet the audience of such an utterance has no way to determine what it is. As the authors note, in other cases the content of a domain restriction must be accessible to an addressee for felicity. They compare the examples in (9) (p. 139).

(9) a. Certain villains are in the room. They are dangerous.

      b. Every villain is in the room. They are dangerous.

(9b) would clearly be infelicitous if the addressee had no means of narrowing down the domain to the villains being talked about, while the same is not true of (9a). Hawthorne and Manley call restrictions which are accessible to an audience "candid", while the inaccessible ones associated with specific indefinites they call "coy"; the idea is that some determiners -- every and the being two -- presuppose a candid restriction while specific indefinites implicate a coy one. Some readers may still feel uncomfortable with this part of the analysis.

The next two chapters extend the covert domain restriction analysis to the more prototypical kinds of referential NPs. Chapter 5, titled "What 'the'", takes up definite descriptions. As is well known, there are two competing views of the semantics of definite descriptions: (i) that they incorporate a constraint of uniqueness, vs. (ii) that they incorporate a constraint of familiarity. The first view is clearly quite in tune with the domain restriction approach, and Hawthorne and Manley suggest that the implication of familiarity that is associated with some uses of definite descriptions -- such as the one in (10)

(10) The terrorist on that roof is smoking a cigarette.

can be derived from that requirement. Specifically, they suggest that since the existence of a unique entity being talked about is presupposed, it must either be part of the common ground or must be something that the addressee can be expected to accept without question, and that is not true in this case (p. 163). However there are more mundane examples that it is not clear will be covered by this explanation -- e.g., (11) (personal communication from Andrew Kehler).

(11) John is reading the book he found on the beach today.

Much of this chapter is taken up with an extended discussion of a "neo-Fregean" alternative analysis, on which the semantic value of a definite description is the entity it denotes. On this view, if that entity does not exist, the whole sentence lacks a truth-value. Hawthorne and Manley consider three arguments in favor of this alternative, as well as five arguments against it, coming to rest in favor of their own analysis.

Chapter 6, "Et tu, 'Brute'", takes up demonstratives and proper names. Demonstratives bear much in common with definite descriptions, so it is fairly natural to extend the analysis of definite descriptions to them, the difference being "supplementality -- the use of a demonstrative conventionally relies on salient supplemental information to help the audience identify the object" (p. 209), while a definite description does not. When it comes to proper names, the authors give a great deal of attention to an analysis according to which names function as predicates -- as they sometimes do overtly, as in She's just another one of those Wilsons -- but ultimately worry that this kind of analysis does not properly distinguish those overtly predicative uses from the more typical uses simply to name some entity.

The final brief chapter, "Afterword", very usefully summarizes the main points made in the book, and raises a number of remaining issues -- a major one being what reference amounts to, and whether there actually are any referential expressions.

This review has pointed out a (very) few places where I have some reservations,[2] so I would like to stress that overall, it is a wonderful book. The authors' writing style is lively (as can perhaps be seen from some of the chapter and section headings), readable, and clear, and their very careful consideration of all sides of every issue should leave readers with a whole new appreciation of the complexity of those issues, and a sense that many of their automatic assumptions about the functioning of NPs in English (and most likely other languages as well) need to be revised.


Breheny, Richard. 2008. A new look at the semantics and pragmatics of numerically Quantified Noun Phrases. Journal of Semantics 25, 93-140.

Chastain, Charles. 1975. Reference and context. In Keith Gunderson, ed., Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. 7: Language Mind and Knowledge. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 194-269.

Evans, Gareth. 1982. The varieties of reference. Edited by John McDowell. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Fodor, Janet Dean & Ivan A. Sag. 1982. Referential and quantificational indefinites. Linguistics and Philosophy 5, 355-398.

Ludlow, Peter & Stephen Neale. 1991. Indefinite descriptions: In defense of Russell. Linguistics and Philosophy 14, 171-202.

Schwarzschild, Roger. 2002. Singleton indefinites. Journal of Semantics 19, 289-314.

[1] This was perhaps argued first by Charles Chastain (1975), who, surprisingly, is one of the few authors in this area not cited by Hawthorne and Manley.

[2] One other small complaint is the number of footnotes (598). Some of these are just citation notes, but the vast majority have content, and some quite a bit.