The Rei(g)n of 'Rule'

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Dana Riesenfeld, The Rei(g)n of 'Rule', Ontos, 2010, 132pp., $92.95 (pbk), ISBN 9783868380859.

Reviewed by Kathrin Glüer, Stockholm University


Is language an essentially rule-governed activity? That the answer to this question is affirmative has struck philosophers of language as immensely plausible throughout the ages. The initial thought might go along the familiar lines of the Wittgensteinian analogy: the relation between the meaning of a word and its use is interestingly similar to that between a rule and its applications. The distinction between correct and incorrect applications is as essential to an expression's being meaningful as it is to there being a rule. And many philosophers have thought that there is more than an analogy; they have taken the meaningful use of linguistic expressions to be essentially rule-guided in a literal sense. There has been less consensus, however, on where to go from here. What kind of rule is essential to language? Are the rules of language prescriptions (norms) that tell speakers what they ought to do with their words or constitutive rules like the rules of chess, or both? Or are the rules of language conventions in a Lewisian sense, regularities that all speakers of a language have common knowledge of? And where do these rules come from? Do they derive from the mere fact that linguistic expressions have meaning or are they somehow responsible for this fact, do they themselves determine these meanings?

These and related questions have seen lively debate over the last fifteen years. At the same time, a growing number of philosophers have voiced skepticism about the idea that meaning is essentially normative, rule-governed, or conventional in any interesting sense. Dana Riesenfeld adds her voice to those of these skeptics in her recent book The Rei(g)n of 'Rule'. Unfortunately she does so in almost complete independence not only of her fellow skeptics, but of the whole of the recent debate. Riesenfeld's skepticism is almost exclusively fuelled by purely conceptual considerations, and her "diagnosis" is that there is something fundamentally wrong with the very concept of a rule. The recurrent theme of the book is that the concept of rule, at least as used by philosophers of language, is incoherent or paradoxical.

Consequently, her conclusion is not that language is not rule-governed. Rather, Riesenfeld declares that

the philosophical disease of rules is terminal, and I offer it no remedy. I do suggest, however, that the philosophy of language cease to depend on the concept of rule as a key concept in attempts to understand how we communicate linguistically with one another and rather treat it with greater care and scepticism (5).

There also is some rather tentative suggestion at the very end of the book that we -- somehow -- ought to overcome all sorts of dichotomies making our concepts incoherent; in the case of rules, such dichotomies include those between ought and is, and the normative and the descriptive.

More precisely, Riesenfeld claims that the concept of a linguistic rule consists of a normative or prescriptive and a conventional or descriptive element. On the one hand, linguistic rules distinguish between correct and incorrect uses of words, they tell us how we ought to talk, and they guide our actions. That's the normative part. On the other hand, however, the concept of a linguistic rule is used to capture the way we actually use our words. That's the descriptive or "conventional" part.

But why would this be inconsistent? Surely it isn't impossible that we actually do what we ought to do? Riesenfeld's attempts to answer this question are prima facie rather puzzling; for instance, when she writes: "Although it is not impossible that normative rules would also be descriptive and that descriptive rules would also be normative, it is not necessary" (3, emphases in the original). Here is another passage:

A theory (or perception) of meaning that views rules as essential cannot afford to dismiss either norms or conventions; the linguistic rule aspires to be both conventional and normative. But, I claim, it cannot. Conventions are not necessarily normative, norms are not necessarily conventional. In other words, there is no essential or necessary connection between the conventional ways of how we in fact act linguistically and normative standards we ought to follow (6).

The idea, then, must be that the concept of a linguistic rule is inconsistent not because the two aspects so far distinguished cannot be jointly satisfied, but rather because the concept in fact contains a third element: that there is a necessary or essential connection between how we ought to use a word and how we in fact use it. It is, I take it, these three aspects that cannot be jointly satisfied according to Riesenfeld.

Before wondering why she thinks that, we might ask what grounds there are for accepting Riesenfeld's 'analysis' of the concept of a linguistic rule. Unfortunately, she does not say. She refers to Railton, makes some use of Lewis's analysis of convention (I shall mostly leave questions of exegetical accuracy to the side throughout this review -- however surprising it may be to read, for instance, that "by [Lewis's] definition a convention cannot allow an agent to be acting against his own preferences" (24)) and of Saussure's understanding of arbitrariness, but otherwise her investigations of concepts such as norm, prescription, and rule are undertaken without any help from such classical mappings of the relevant terrain as, for instance, von Wright's. Most of the distinctions many writers on linguistic rules have found helpful and important -- distinctions such as that between constitutive and non-constitutive rules, or that between hypothetical imperatives or instrumental norms and genuine prescriptions -- are used rather idiosyncratically, if at all. Searle's classical formula for a constitutive rule ('X counts as Y in C'), for instance, does not make a single appearance throughout the book.

Even more seriously, Riesenfeld never tells us what the precise target of her "diagnosis" is: Are the rules in question semantic or pragmatic rules? What exactly are they supposed to be essential for? Towards the end of the book, Riesenfeld not only attacks Searle's idea that there are constitutive rules for speech acts, but also Davidson's principle of charity. At the very least, then, the object of the attack seems to be any kind of rule essential to the use or interpretation of language, be it semantic or pragmatic. Maybe the thought is that the generality of the diagnosis justifies the generality of the attack, and also the negligence towards what from this perspective might appear as misguided, over-sophisticated distinctions. But that makes the question only more urgent: whence the force of the general diagnosis? I haven't been able to find out. I fear it is supposed to derive from some sort of direct insight into the concept. At times, Riesenfeld describes what she is doing as "focused on the way philosophers . . . of language have thought about rules" (119), but no such exercise -- especially one that does not pay attention to the literature of the last ten years -- would license the conclusion she in fact draws: that the very concept of linguistic rule is beyond remedy.

Which brings us back to the question of why we should think that the three conditions that make up Riesenfeld's concept of a linguistic rule cannot be jointly met. I shall approach this question by taking a look at the dialectic of the remainder of the book.

It consists of four short chapters applying the initial diagnosis to a number of philosophers and their writings on linguistic rules. First in line are those in some way inspired by Wittgenstein: Cavell, Kripke, Baker and Hacker, Meredith Williams and Cora Diamond. To round things off, Davidson and Searle both receive a short chapter. All of these treatments are short and sketchy. Readers not already familiar with, for instance, Kripkenstein's rule-following skepticism will most probably not be able to get much out of them. Those familiar with these well-travelled waters will probably find most of the readings on offer somewhat surprising.

According to Riesenfeld, pretty much all of these writers in one way or another try to reduce the concept of a rule either to its normative or to its 'conventional' aspect. Kripke's skeptical solution, for instance, is read as an attempt to account for the normativity of meaning by reducing it to mere 'conventionality'. Any such attempt is bound to fail, Riesenfeld claims, because it "reduces correctness to the actions of the majority" (119). Baker and Hacker also pursue reduction, according to Riesenfeld, but in the opposite direction: they are charged with trying to reduce 'conventionality' to normativity. And that cannot work either because "By renouncing conventionality, we assent to a theory of language that is not necessarily connected with actual speech behaviour" (119). The thought seems to be this: Semantic correctness cannot merely be a question of majority use; there must be a 'real ought' involved. A 'real ought', however, is too independent from what we actually do; a 'real ought' can obtain even if nobody ever does what they ought to do. The question then becomes how to connect the two.

Riesenfeld next construes Meredith Williams' reading of Wittgenstein's rule-following considerations as an attempt at answering precisely this question. She describes Williams as trying "to develop a concept of rule following that is both normative and necessary" (8), but claims that this is "a conceptual blunder" (39). Prescriptions, the premise here seems to be, are essentially such that they can be violated. At least that is what I take passages like the following to be saying:

A normative action is not necessary. Unlike necessity, normativity always leaves room for the normative injunction not to be carried out, intentionally or unintentionally, for justified reasons or for unjustified ones. This is the basic characterization of normativity as expressed by the is/ought distinction; the inherent possibility that what ought to be is not what actually takes place (12).

So, you ought to do A only if it is possible for you not to do A. Ergo, if you must do A, if it is necessary that you do A, it is not the case that you ought to do A. Trying to bridge the gap between what we ought to do and what we actually do by adding "an element of necessity" (120) won't work, Riesenfeld's 'master argument' goes, because a rule we must follow simply is no rule at all.

This master argument is then applied to Cavell's idea that we must mean what we say, Davidson's claim that the principle of charity is the constitutive principle of meaning, and Searle's conception of constitutive rules. Although these views are on the surface very different, Riesenfeld finds the following basic idea in all of them: "Their idea is that if we find that language is constituted by rules, then the difficulty of how these rules are connected with actual linguistic behaviour would evaporate for then we simply must, by definition, follow them" (120). This characterization is, of course, vastly off the mark -- especially regarding Davidson. Riesenfeld is to some extent aware of this, but she thinks that even Davidson -- despite all his efforts -- does not manage to get rid of the rules of meaning. They resurface, according to her, in his insistence on charity as the constitutive principle of interpretation and the normative nature of the 'rules' of rationality. Thus even Davidson gets entangled in the conceptual pitfalls surrounding the concept of linguistic rule and tries to have what cannot be: "normativity without norms" (104).

At the very end of the book, Riesenfeld goes one step further: "Supplementing rules with the added ingredient of necessity" not only "depletes normativity of its meaning" (120). It also

gives rise to a paradox of rules; if rules are considered constitutive (of speech acts, as Searle claims, or of interpretation, as Davidson argues) then there is no meaning to the idea of their being violated. On the other hand, if rules can be violated, they are reduced to suggestions or recommendations, lacking obligatory power (120).

If we take this at all seriously, I guess the point would be that the very idea of a prescription or an obligation -- of something that obliges you without forcing you -- is self-undermining. Since Riesenfeld's own line of argument is wholly based on this idea and its supposed tension with the other elements in her conception of linguistic rules, this would be shooting herself in the foot, indeed.

Even if we disregard this 'paradox', however, Riesenfeld's master argument is spurious. She thinks that linguistic rules are essentially such that they are both prescriptive for, and descriptive of, our actual linguistic practice. This might not be our common conception of a linguistic rule, but there is nothing incoherent about it. There might even be some motivation for thinking of linguistic rules in this way; after all, meaning surely somehow is determined by actual use, even if Riesenfeld herself never provides any such argument. But there simply is no reason to think that making both elements essential to something's being a linguistic rule is the same thing as making that rule impossible to violate.

This is mistaken mainly for a perfectly general reason that does not even have anything to do with rules. Take a concept C. There are two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for something's being a C: A and B. Assume further that A's can be but aren't necessarily B's, and vice versa. Nevertheless, any C necessarily is both A and B. There is nothing incoherent about C. All it takes to instantiate C are some A's that actually are B's.

Applying this reasoning to linguistic rules (as conceived of by Riesenfeld), what we get is the result that a rule is linguistic only insofar as it is actually followed. This might strike us as counterintuitive, but these are her conditions, not ours. The point is that there is nothing incoherent about it. It simply does not follow that we are dealing with a rule that cannot be violated. The rule can be violated all you want. It's just not linguistic anymore if you do. On this construal, being linguistic is like being-actually-followed: There is nothing incoherent about the idea of a rule that is actually being followed. If you don't follow it, it ceases to be a rule that is actually being followed, but it does not cease to be a rule. Nor is a rule that is actually being followed a rule that cannot be violated.

Moreover, such a conception of linguistic rules is actually less counterintuitive than it might prima facie appear. Think of it this way: For these rules, being 'linguistic' simply means being a rule of a language that is actually spoken. Then, you might think that it is constitutive of something's being English that the following rule or prescription is in force for its speakers:

(G) It is correct/You ought to apply 'green' to an object o iff o is green.

Moreover, for something's being English, it surely is not required that rules like (G) are always followed. Obviously, even competent speakers of English make the occasional mistake and call a red thing 'green'. As long as that doesn't happen too often, or too systematically, such a 'rule' nevertheless describes the practice of speaking English. What is essential, then, to English being the language that is actually spoken by a speaker or group of speakers is that their use of 'green' by and large is in accordance with this rule. If it isn't, they speak a (slightly) different language -- or none at all. Needless to say, I think there are tons of problems with suggestions like this one. But it does not fall prey to the crude machinery of Riesenfeld's purely conceptual 'master argument'. Maybe the most important thing to be learned from all this is the following: whatever the allure of diagnostic analysis (of the conceptual kind), we simply cannot dispense with careful, detailed, and precise philosophical argument.