The Relevance of Royce

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Kelly A. Parker and Jason Bell (eds.), The Relevance of Royce, Fordham University Press, 2014, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823255283.

Reviewed by Roger Ward, Georgetown College


This fine collection, edited by Kelly Parker and Jason Bell, showcases both the historical richness and the contemporary applicability of the philosophy of Josiah Royce. Royce scholarship, championed by many of the volume's contributors, is in a definite waxing phase. The need for the volume is a bit of a puzzle given that Royce is such a fecund philosophical mind, his career at Harvard spanned the golden age of pragmatism, and his books, associated personalities, students and cultural events collectively form a unique and powerful tapestry. Still, much of Royce remains untapped and unclaimed for the last 100 years. The volume seems to ask why Royce shouldn't be added to the three classical pillars, Peirce, James, and Dewey.

The book has two sections, historical explorations and practical extensions of Royce's thought. It is undisputed that Royce influenced the trajectory of philosophy in America and beyond; this volume concretizes his influence. But it is also a self-examination by American philosophers about what it is about Royce that keeps him still on the periphery of our philosophical self-consciousness. So, this book is a moral exercise in understanding our obligation to this devoted mind, an examination of our affections perhaps, and a speculative engagement with the puzzle of why we keep Royce close, but are not yet wed to his philosophy.

The historical explorations begin with John McDermott's address to the Royce Society claiming that Royce is alive and well. McDermott says that this vivacity extends from Royce's focus on the issue that haunted him, "the relation between the individual and the infinite God, between the single, the particular, and an infinite series, and between human frailty both caused by us and visited upon us and an ostensibly caring divine providence. Royce's word for these tensions is suffering, perhaps intractable." (19) Royce's favorite Greek dramatist Aeschylus wrote in the Agamemnon that "wisdom comes only through suffering." McDermott adds that in addition to James's rhetorically brilliant punts and Dewey's spiritual healthiness, "I need Royce as well." (20)

In "A Report on the Recent 'Dig' into Royce's MSS in the Harvard Archives," Frank Oppenheim, Dawn Aberg, and John Kaag relate both the scope of the boxes of the Harvard Archive Royce Papers (HARP) and their work in 2008 and 2009 to create a comprehensive index of the writings of the 155 boxes (99-155 are the most unfamiliar) for a total of 38,750 pages. They present some initial "finds," including a 110 unpublished MS on "The Conception of Immortality," and the source material for some "clippings" from previous writings Royce compiled in the Religious Aspect of Philosophy. (27) The work of the team is now accessible through its Comprehensive Index of the Josiah Royce Papers in the Harvard University Archives.

Dwayne Tunstall, in a very lucid, flowing chapter, confronts the problem of Royce's response to the new realism's challenge by his students, including Ralph Perry, to the idealist consensus in American philosophy. Royce makes his most sustained and persuasive reply in The World and the Individual to the realist's characteristics of a mind-independent world. He contends knowledge is impossible apart from a superhuman interpretive process that "interprets" all entities into a coherent cosmic Whole. "For Royce, knowing -- far from being a passive witnessing of a ready-made world -- is always a novel, creative process." (45)

Jason Bell traces the connection between Royce and Husserl through the experience of Winthrop Bell, a student in Göttingen as the First World War began. Husserl asked his Canadian student to write his dissertation on Royce, and when completed he praised it. But due to the political situation the Göttingen faculty voted to annul his doctorate. (49) While a prisoner of war Bell lectured and wrote on phenomenology, and after the war he received his degree in 1922. Bell was the first teacher of phenomenology at Harvard from 1922-1927; his students included Dorion Cairns and Charles Hartshorne, who afterward became Husserl's more celebrated followers. (54) Jason Bell shows that Royce's development of phenomenology in 1879 notebooks and its present in the subtitle The Religious Aspect of Philosophy as "phenomenology of the religious consciousness" in 1885 predates Husserl. Through a correspondence link, Winthrop Bell discovered that William Hocking had introduced Royce to Husserl in 1902, filling out the picture of Husserl's interest in having Bell develop his dissertation. (67)

Mathew Foust and Melissa Shew explore Royce's interest and use of Aristotle in "Loyalty, Friendship, and Truth." Although Royce is most often aligned with Plato, he did write several essays on Aristotle in the 1870s. Foust and Shaw argue that Royce employs Greek vitalism as a critique of modern science and philosophy, combating "a nonphilosophical materialistic worldview," (73) though Royce's vitalism "denies purposiveness outside of nature itself." (75) They examine Aristotle's notion that creative action in doing good is required for friendship in relation to Royce's loyalty as an emergent property of the value of the bond of friendship. (81) Similarly, they compare Aristotle's notion of community as "harmonious activity of the whole nature of the happy person" (84) and Royce's formulation that if a person has made "no choice for himself of the cause that he serves, he has not yet come to his rational self, he has not yet found his business as a moral agent." (85)

Randall Auxier ("Complex Negation, Necessity, and Logical Magic") takes the reader on a wild logical ride. The magic is the way Royce finds a logical path from the negation of a particular negative proposition, an O, to affirm the truth of the Universal affirmative claim (as unfalsified in his system) that All experience is mine. In the process, Auxier traverses the seas of complex negation (more than simple dyad of not), individuality as a communal achievement that poses a demand of generalization on philosophical descriptions (90), and the necessity of attention such that "inclusion and the mode of possibility precede exclusion and the first experience of necessity, which is converted from whatever proves to be impossible for the experiencer." (94) The will, for Royce, is an effect rather than a cause, a "plan of action," that emerges in a "new principle of individuation in the work of loving the object into uniqueness, forsaking all others." (97) The ground of necessity is "an unwillingness to act otherwise." (97) The logical landscape opens because Royce is not a radical empiricist, wedding himself to a "bit of unempirical logical magic" to arrive at the Absolute. (115) This possibilist philosophy addresses genuine doubts, is assured of speaking to real and possible individuals, works within limitations and includes a means of catching mistakes. Auxier calls this a sort of "particularist Cogito ergo sum" but without mistaking existence for a predicate, making sense of the our recognition of error that implies "a larger world of truth relative to which the error is an error." (130)

Scott Pratt examines Royce's contested value as a thinker about race and the logic of pluralistic self-determination. There are risks and problems of any effort to order human lives, and the potential of Royce's approach is "what it can add to the self-criticism of those of us raised in the European tradition," and he suggests that with Royce we can see how we have "failed to see our role in the history of the land we occupy." (134) Royce argues against William Jevons, Alexander Chamberlain, Franz Boas and others that taboos are logically thought of as experimental developments in response to circumstances. (136) Exclusions, like taboos, incorporate the logic of Peirce's 1898 lectures on the logic of relations to place the agent "between the alternatives." (140) "Social consciousness," Pratt writes, "marks the unification of purpose among diverse individuals," (140) and "pluralism is necessary also for agency." (141) While Royce agrees with James Mark Baldwin's Thought and Things to support the social basis of self-consciousness, he disagrees with Baldwin and Lucien Lévy-Bruhl that agency requires boundaries and elimination of difference. By this logic, natives may overthrow settlers, but "such a reversal is not necessarily a change, and it certainly does not eliminate the logical inheritance of the West." (147) What is required is a movement beyond a system of given classifications and relations of inclusion and exclusion toward a dynamic system that "recognizes the place of agency and its reliance on the relation of betweeness." (147) Thus, a Roycean logic of agency may provide a useful alternative in understanding oppression and moving toward liberation. (148)

The second part of the book focuses on practical extensions of Royce's thought. Douglas Anderson ("Individuals Ain't Ones") tracks Peirce's influence on Royce that led him to avoid a Berkeleyan nominalistic Platonism and provided a ground for his description of finite individuality. (152) Royce dissociates a full and finally determinate One of the Eleatic view from an individual that exhibits life by developing uniqueness. This reflects Peirce's scholastic realism, which holds that things are general, whereas an individual is a cluster of potentialities, a habit. (155) Since for Peirce and Royce you are your expression, not merely an external cause of it (157), the impetus for coordination is on a developing telos that is opened and constrained. "In Peircean terminology," Anderson writes, "Royce's individual is not one-categorized but involves all the categorical modes: the generality of thirdness, the uniqueness of secondness, and the vagueness and spontaneity of firstness." (158) Royce had several worries about individuality including that risk of becoming a nominalistic entity, fading into anonymity. (158) Anderson applies these concerns to teaching by exploring ways to bring students' to their individuality, aims, capacities, accomplishments, and limitations. Education should develop tools of self-expression, avoiding the extremes of favoring an end of education that is either a "sheerly contingent causing a new phenomenon or deterministic working out of determinate ends." (161) He wonders what a Roycean conception would mean for our understanding of personhood and child rearing and encourages us to hear Royce's voice even if we are not convinced by his claims.

Jacquelyn Ann Kegley takes up criticism of Royce's thinking on race . Her essay revolves around the questions, "Is Royce a racist?" and what racism means. Marilyn Fischer argues that Royce is a "racial conservative," following his teacher Joseph Le Conte in the Lamarckian notion that social customs are heritable, which supports expected limits to the capacity for civilization for some groups. (169) Kegley enumerates evidence against this claim and states "in light of Royce's whole corpus of writings and philosophy, it is difficult for me to see him as a wholehearted advocate for white supremacy." (171-2) She also challenges Fischer's interpretation of Royce's comments on the Japanese, which Kegley takes as a warning about constructing false images of peoples built on slim evidence. Another dispute is the relation of Royce's thought on race to Sydney Olivier's concerning Jamaica. Kegley finds Royce agreeing with Olivier that colonialism had proved harmful to native populations, and she says Fisher overdraws conclusions about any imperialism on the part of Royce. Royce's answer to races living together is "English administration and English reticence" -- good courts, square treatment, a health system, and a place for both races inside the system. (176) "We are disposed," Royce writes in "Race Questions", "to view as a fatal and overwhelming race-problem what is a perfectly curable accident of our present form of administration." Kegley summarizes, "we were wrong in our views about the Japanese, and we are wrong in our estimate of the blacks and in the belief that the race problem cannot be solved except by control or terror." (177) Kegley describes Royce's understanding of a "wise provincialism" as one that incorporates unassimilated strangers by giving them a fair chance to become part of a well-knit organization (184), and she concludes by agreeing with Tunstall that Royce advocated for communities that fostered genuine individual growth and development. (188)

In "Enlightened Provincialism, Open Ended Communities, and Loylaty-Loving Individuals," Judith Green presents Royce's three-part progressive prescription for democratic cultural transformation. (190) She contrasts the "mob spirit," such as the tea party, which Royce describes as "sympathizing rather than criticizing under the influence of atavistic ideas," to activities of shared social hope. (191) Rather than overcome our provincial cultures, we need what Royce called "higher provincialism," serving a higher form of self-consciousness that emphasizes ideals. (194) Open communities are those that exhibit "real, achieved unity amidst multiplicity" through translocal memories and hopes that provide a ground for interpretation. (197-200) Green advises that we intellectuals live "as exemplars of the change we would bring about more broadly: We must live as wellsprings of loyalty-loving critical openness to variety and creative renewal." (201)

Richard Mullin challenges the fragmentation of current philosophy in "Josiah Royce and the Redemption of American Individualism." He focuses on the development of the kind of individualism "that devalues the national community and perhaps all communities." (204) Royce describes the disharmony producing this tension as "spiritual warfare of mutual observation . . . and envy and of gossip," forming a hostile account of the consciences of their neighbors. (205-206). Royce's response is a need for a "Christian doctrine of life" open to Christians and non-Christians, good for all because without it "individuals may fall into insignificance." (211) Mullin concludes with the encouragement that we are capable of membership in a community that we "absolutely need in order to achieve our autonomous, individual self." (212)

Frank Oppenheim ("Royce's Relevance for Intrafaith Dialogue") explores Royce's ideas for their usefulness and potential for sponsoring dialogue between religions because, as Hans Küng puts it, "No world peace without peace between the religions." (214) Oppenheim scouts Royce's entire work for a possible grounding for intrafaith dialogue. First, Royce is a pragmatist in testing religion's success in dealing with real problems of its civilization. The need for salvation or overcoming beyond the temporal duration of life requires loyalty to a "superhuman organization" that transcends the visible church uniting all people, in which the faithful exhibit "tolerance for the faiths whose meaning one cannot understand." (218) Royce focuses on questions of what makes a Christian, and how the unity of faith requires a "simplified Christology" in order to enrich its spirit. (221) Royce says "when in ages past Christian believers had used the name 'Christ,' what they meant was 'the symbol for the Spirit in whom the faithful -- that is to say the loyal -- always are and have been one.'" (223) The bedrock principle for Royce, Oppenheim says, is that "the crowning office of all human religion is to aid people to become members of, and grow in the one invisible church," applying the arts that shall win persons over to unity and overcome the original hatefulness of communities. (224) Oppenheim raises critical questions for Royce's approach, including the adequacy of an inclusive definition of the "core of the faith" and dealing with the historical Jesus and the connection between the individual man and the Logos-Spirit. (226)

Kara Barnette applies Royce's ideas as a potent resource for feminist epistemology in "Necessary Error." Her focus is on developing methods of error sensitivity to enrich concepts of epistemological privilege. Royce's "Error and Truth" establishes that truth has no meaning in isolation, and error exposes the finitude of our judgments in light of the Absolute. (231) The absence of a "higher inclusive thought" means there is no external object and hence no truth or error possible. Barnette employs Sandra Harding's notion of oppression reflecting epistemic privilege and standpoint theory to legal inquiries, especially sexual assaults, in which experiences of rape are downplayed due to overarching structures of patriarchy in policing. (236) Barnette says that to be "error sensitive, communities must resist making assumptions about the epistemic privilege" of other communities. (240) According to Royce, "finding truth and producing knowledge must be antidogmatic acts," (240) dependent on the interpretation constituting the Beloved Community. A shift in legal focus from guilt or innocence to judging the error in accounts will "reflect a creative knowledge making process," in which judgments are in time but not fixed truths, as the interpretative process of the community is ongoing and infinite. (245)

In "Communities in Pursuit of Community" Mary Mahowald develops her interpretation of Royce's claim that his entire philosophy was encapsulated in his conception of community. (246) She develops an ideal of community, pragmatically implemented and egalitarian, consistent with that of Amartya Sen. (247) This method holds that "particular communities serve as means to the end of Community," (248) a reality that is constituted by unique individuals who voluntarily pursue a common cause. (249) What is needful for particular communities is "a Cause that unites them all." (250) Individualism obstructs the collaborative work that transcends each particular person toward mutual human flourishing. (253) John Ladd's criticism of objectivist theories that stand on policies that articulate meanings like flourishing that "are good for everyone" leads to Mahowald's application of standpoint theory and a reversal of privilege, such that "members of a the dominant community are empowered to correct and expand their vision; members of the nondominant community are empowered to participate meaningfully in decision making." (256) Mahowald applies her method to prenatal tests to determine disabilities for the purpose of ending a pregnancy. This issue reveals both the community of families of disabled children and advocates of women's rights in reproduction, separating approaches between utilitarian and egalitarian ethics. (259) While not resolving a question like abortion and the rights of the unborn, Mahowald's egalitarian formulation shows that causes pursued by feminists and advocates of people with disabilities can be compatible in attributing the same value to individuals. To the extent that they do this, they exhibit the notion of communities as a means to an ideal Community, but not all do. (261) Mahowald defends her idealistic conception of community as pragmatic because it "provides grounds for critiquing the self-defeating individualistic interests of particular communities" consistent with Peirce's and Royce's ideas that only if an idea of community exists in people's minds can there be sustainable progress toward it. (263)

As an exercise in determining the relevance of Josiah Royce to the current trends in philosophy, especially American philosophy, the essays in this volume operate at several levels. One level is acknowledging the generative ground of our current trends of thought. At this level Royce appears not only relevant, but essential. At another level, relevance means the posing of questions or criticism that demand response, where ignoring the thinker puts one's own thought in jeopardy of error or inconsistency. Royce is relevant in this way for those thinkers sunk already into the American tradition, especially in relation to those thinkers concerned to accurately describe and respond to Peirce and James. Perhaps for phenomenologists, too, Royce is relevant in this way. A third level of relevance is that way in which ideas or phrases worm their way into the very language of our self-understanding, like Shakespeare's phrases that are now in our lexicons. James is relevant in this way, even though his thought moves in ad hoc ways. I do not find this kind of relevance described in this volume, and perhaps this is the frustrating reality for fans of Royce. Despite his passionate defense of the community and his systematic brilliance, the true test of a philosopher's place in the pantheon of greats is when one's thought becomes ingredient in the creative conceptualization of a community of thinkers who are striving to embrace the real or the true or whatever it is that keeps us up at night. I think it is hubris to say who will or won't become relevant for the rarified air of the future community of philosophers, but at this time, from this volume, I believe that river has yet to be crossed for Royce, though he undoubtedly deserves far more attention than he has been given, and that argument is well made by these authors.