The Religion of the Future

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Roberto Mangabeira Unger, The Religion of the Future, Harvard University Press, 2014, 468pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674729070.

Reviewed by Jeremy David Bendik-Keymer, Case Western Reserve University


Roberto Mangabeira Unger's new book is one of two that continue the project he laid out in The Self Awakened.[1] The other, The Singular Universe and the Reality of Time, is forthcoming this year.[2] Unger's project is to create the context for human self-transformation through a gradualist and fragmentary cultural and political revolution grounded in naturalism.[3] He seeks a world in which we live in the present, free of repression of, or reactive attitudes towards, the existential limitations of being human (chapter 7, passim) and in which we act collectively to create the conditions for ongoing innovation and self-transformation (chapter 6, passim). Basically, he wants us to grow up to accept both our limited situation and our creative, free potential -- open to each other as people and working in solidarity to create a freer society through ongoing institutional transformation. What does religion have to do with this project in Romantic freedom?

The Self Awakened announced this latest version of Unger's life-long project by focusing especially on the "context transcending" capability of human imagination, a point Martin Stone has helpfully identified as Sartrean.[4] In that book as well, Unger stated the goal of the transformation: for humans to become "more godlike" (341ff.). This tranformational process, however, is not intended to be anti-modern or super-natural, and it is intended to fully affirm our freedom. Hence, Unger has promised that The Singular Universe will make the case for the fundamental reality of time in the universe as the one constant around which anything else -- including natural laws -- can change. This, Unger claims, will provide the naturalistic basis for the possibility of radical novelty: a challenge to determinism. With the ground cleared for novelty, then, The Religion of the Future makes the case for the broad outlines of what Unger thinks is the one clear way in which we humans can, over time gradually and fragmentarily, build a world and reshape our minds in such a way that we become more and more "godlike" -- sharing the good attributes traditionally ascribed to divinity. It would not be imprecise to see this as a fulfillment of (one reading of) Renaissance humanism, in the spirit of della Mirandola, whose philosophical anthropology is so important as a broad background supposition for modern philosophy from Descartes through Rousseau through Sartre. We are the beings whose essence is to be able to "fashion ourselves in any form that we prefer."[5] And, as in the Oration, our doing so attests to our closeness to "god."

But della Mirandola was writing within a theocratic order using a pre-modern cosmology devoid of empiricism. Why do we need religious talk now to focus our freedom? Unger's argument depends on the case he can make for religion's privileged relationship to freedom. That he tries to make such a case distinguishes his project from many others concerning freedom that accept broadly humanistic assumptions. The core of the book can be seen as Unger's attempt to free religion enough from its traditional connotations that he can work out the relationship. What he seems to maintain is the utopian moment in the religiousness of, say, Paul (281-82), converted to his activist vision: "the form of the world is passing away" (1 Corinthians 7:31) -- only if we make it so.

Unger's strategy is this: he posits an ahistorical, unchanging motivational set to human beings. This set is expressed as a set of needs or vulnerabilities. They are in some sense traumatic or at least anxiety-provoking when avoided or met poorly. We become unfree or less free when we are tangled up in them (Heidegger, one of the few reference points in this book, seems to loom large here, (see 361-63)). Only that which can meet these needs well enough to allow us to become untangled in our freedom, therefore, can be central to realizing our freedom. Not surprisingly, it is only something he calls "religion" that can do this, i.e., can meet our unchanging existential needs well enough to allow us to use our freedom to become more and more "intense" in our lives (272), to address "the longing for a larger existence" (255) that is, in effect, simply living in the present open to our creative tasks and potential for creative cooperation with each other.

But what Unger calls "religion" may not be recognizable as religion on any close analogy to the major historical religions of human history, except perhaps -- he thinks -- to Christianity. To show that this is so, Unger groups all of human religion into a set of three alternative spiritual orientations (trying to be unconcerned with the world through abstraction, trying to make conventions satisfy us even when we don't feel they fit, and struggling to find or create a new world up ahead). He includes classical philosophy and secular humanism therein (both tendentiously), and then proceeds to claim to show how each of the three orientations is unsatisfactory for addressing our existential needs. That he holds onto religion as the concept for meeting these needs is a result of the special mode of "vision" (a term dating back to his earliest writing, on poetry, in 1968[6]) that religion has involved in the Semitic religions, what he also calls "prophesy." In other words, religion has a privileged relationship to imagination, and Unger seems to think that a space for an especially intense form of imagination is needed to address our existential situation. This is, as I have said, a space for a utopian moment where we "Awake" (359) to our creative and cooperative potential from out of our neediness that has us tangled up.

Everything hinges on the existential needs, then. Accordingly, Unger begins his book with them. They are the most important assumptions of it. The three needs are: the need to face our deaths in a way that gives our lives meaning, the need to make sense out of our lives when they appear ultimately groundless, and the need to find enough satisfaction in life not to be torn apart by our "insatiability" (1-23).

The sum effect of these needs outlines for Unger a situation, which he calls "belittlement" (24ff.). Belittlement is the term Unger uses to express any response to our needs that involves our becoming merely resigned or avoidant. For instance, one might become bitter in the face of death, a fundamentalist in the face of existence's mystery, or throw oneself into the pleasures of the flesh or of food. In any of these cases, our existential need would be avoided by belittling ourselves. The person who becomes bitter at the fact that things come to an end loses the clarity of his time, which undercuts his decision. The person who becomes a fundamentalist loses the free use of his reason. And the person who throws himself into pleasure loses the freedom of choosing to transform desire into something non-egotistical that outlasts us. And so on. Unger is after the things that allow us to resist belittlement, and he thinks that ultimately religious imagination will be needed to do so.

Why should this be so? The common thread among the needs Unger assumes is our critical subjectivity. It is only because it is up to us to think about how we should live that we do not accept a fixed way to live, i.e., that the sense of life is open to revision constantly. It is not because existence is groundless that we are self-conscious, but because we are self-conscious, deciding what seems best, that existence must be given grounds, constantly. As della Mirandola well understood, it is our power of evaluation that unsettles all of life and makes us figure out its grounds. But once having done so, everything we might want or have to face is likewise thrown into question: our desires become unfixed, and even death becomes objectionable.

Unger seems to think that the heart of evaluation is imagination -- what he calls "vision." I did not find an argument for this claim in th book. He may give it elsewhere, but its absence creates a problem for his argument. Why should vision be the key to evaluation? I think what Unger has in mind is the imagining of possibilities that are not yet seen. Perhaps I need to be able to really imagine possibilities to be able to figure out how I should live. But even if this is obviously true, it does not follow that the kinds of possibilities I need are prophetic, or that we even know anymore what "prophetic" possibility means, or that it would obviously be needed to address, say, social justice. One of the problems with Unger's book is that the language he uses often "goes on holiday," to echo Wittgenstein (Philosophical Investigations, I.38) -- although the results are so vague that there does not even seem to be a distinct problem created. Besides, there are obviously many ways to keep our sense of possibility alive, and many of them seem more likely to support a gradual, fragmentary, ongoing transformation of society and us better than Romantic moments of waking up to life's intensity.

Of course, the biggest problem with Unger's broad argument is that it is contradictory. He cannot both say that, e.g., "Our insatiability condemns us forever" (271), and that "there is nothing that does not change, sooner or later" (266). He cannot posit the humanistic moment from della Mirandola or Sartre (by way of Rousseau's focus on institutions of politics and education) and yet help himself to an ahistorical form of mid-20th century existential psychology in the spirit of Ernest Becker. This really is having his cake and eating it too. I could not find any charitable way around his contradiction, and its presence and the absence of any serious engagement with it struck me as a failure.

Added to this failure is the obvious questionableness of the existential needs Unger posits. On what grounds should we accept their conceptualization and the motivational importance Unger gives them? It seems to me that Unger could have argued in one of several ways: (1) he could have deduced the needs from a wider ontology; (2) he could have provided empirical evidence that the needs are pervasive and widespread and exclusively motivating; (3) he could, at the least, have considered prima facie counter-examples to the motivating qualities of the needs as he understands them; (4) it would also have been helpful if Unger dealt with the roughly post-structuralist literatures that have developed in the aftermath of Foucault and which make ahistorical psychological claims problematic because of the historical constraints and conditions of the concepts used in them and the forms of life in which those concepts are articulated, studied, and implemented. However, Unger does none of these four things. Even if he has done them elsewhere, he makes no mention of. This is, again, a flaw -- I think a major one. It amounts to an absence of a serious method of reasoning.[7] To put the matter bluntly, Unger's existential psychology is make-believe.[8]

Part of being "context transcending" is that we have a range of things we can need in existence to find meaning in it and a range of ways we can understandably build up reactions to our felt needs. I was surprised that Unger, so aware of our constitutional openness as beings, would pigeonhole us. I can think of some ordinary people who have a settled sense of their reason for being, are at peace with mortality, and are pretty well content with life. None of them is a fundamentalist, and they have thought about the meaning of life. They have their own minds and are critical of authoritarian power. They would not recognize themselves as craven, anxiety-ridden, clueless or basically egotistical. Nor would it be fair to say that they are especially deluded or unimaginative or unfree. They are ordinary people who think for themselves and have worked out how they want to live. Unger's fairly extreme language and almost reactive picture of who we are seems to force people into the position of being immature humans.[9] I found it distasteful, even disrespectful, and false. One of the rhetorical tics of the book is that Unger keeps speaking for "us" ("We . . . " etc., 1ff.).

But in a book of almost 500 pages, there is no more than a handful of concrete references, never precise enough to engage with a page or a passage (the one quotation, from Aquinas, neglects to give a citation). There is no empirical evidence given, even though much history is discussed. There are literally no close readings of text, even though the scriptural religions are at the center of half of the book. There is almost no discussion -- or if any, only selective -- of the internal variety within religious and philosophical traditions. There are missed obvious counter-examples. There are sweeping generalizations. There are glaring contradictions. And, to my mind, many things simply did not follow -- and left unexplained. In short, Unger avoids the context needed for critical dialogue -- for any warrant to speak for us.

We know Unger wants to create the conditions for what he calls "deep freedom" (chapter 6), which involves a commitment to perpetually innovating democracy. So it seems to me that he has simply missed the mark. But I am not entirely sure of this, because his picture of our existential neediness begins with a dehumanizing view of us as needy, terrified, clueless, and craven people. In contradiction with the "virtues of connection" he discusses late in his book (370ff.), this way of seeing us is belittling. And then he avoids common objects in which the equality of intelligences can meet -- objects such as texts read in common, empirical evidence examined, and methods precisely framed. So his manner of writing ends up passively authoritarian. Unger may think of his work as preparation for prophesy, but it ends up as pontification.

[1] Roberto Mangabeira Unger, The Self Awakened: Pragmatism Unbound, Harvard University Press, 2007.

[2] Roberto Mangabeira Unver and Lee Smolin, The Singular Universe and the Reality of Time: A Proposal in Natural Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2014 (forthcoming)

[3] Unger has collected his work helpfully on his website, accessed August 12, 2014.

[4] See Martin Stone's review of the book on this website almost exactly seven years ago, accessed August 12, 2014.

[5] The celebrated passage, which evolved into a life of its own far from its initial context, of Giovanni Pico della Mirandola's Oration on the Dignity of Man (1486).

[6] Roberto Mangabeira Unger, "Poetry and Vision," MS, 1968, accessed August 12, 2014.

[7] Late in the book, Unger discusses his "method" for developing his view of religion (344ff.). Surprisingly, there is almost no recognizable discussion of method in this section except some remarks in opposition to vague objections he thinks will be raised to his program. He does, however, claim that "contemporary philosophy" has "near useless . . . methods" (350) -- a point made with no references to specific pieces of contemporary philosophy.

[8] Cf. Harry Frankfurt, On Bullshit, Princeton University Press, 2005.

[9] "Terrified by the certainty of death, forced to recognize our inability to understand the ground of being and of existence, and tormented by insatiable desire, for people if not for things, we have cause to wake to life from our daze of resignation to belittlement" (359).