The Remains of Being: Hermeneutic Ontology after Metaphysics

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Santiago Zabala, The Remains of Being: Hermeneutic Ontology after Metaphysics, Columbia University Press, 2009, 178pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231148306.

Reviewed by Iain Thomson, University of New Mexico


Postmodernism isn't what it used to be. As a meaningful philosophical movement (rather than a vague term of disparagement), "postmodernism" primarily designated a diverse series of Heidegger-inspired attempts to situate and guide our late-modern historical age by uncovering and transcending its most destructive metaphysical presuppositions. Ironically, however, the only major contemporary philosophers still willing to call themselves "postmodernists" have renounced that "utopian" quest for a philosophical passage beyond modernity. From their perspective, the definitive Heideggerian hope for a "postmodern" understanding of being looks like a retro-futuristic fantasy, a quaint image of what the future might have been, which (like the Jetsons or Steampunk) has now been rendered obsolete. Unfortunately, when self-described "postmodernists" abandon the attempt to identify and transcend the distinctive problems of modernity, they empty the philosophical movement of its primary meaning and purpose, allowing the label to degenerate into a vague shorthand many philosophers use merely to deride and dismiss "that-relativistic-and-trendy-nonsense-they-read-in-other-humanities-departments-instead-of-studying-real-philosophy."[1]

The philosophers who best fit this paradoxical description -- "postmodernists" who no longer seek to get beyond modernity -- are Richard Rorty and Gianni Vattimo. One of the two leading Italian Heideggerians (Heideggerianism being the philosophical mainstream in Italy), Vattimo is probably most famous for being an openly gay and Catholic member of the European Parliament.[2] But Vattimo's philosophical work is no less incongruous: Vattimo seeks to show that his own anti-foundationalist, post-Heideggerian hermeneutics (which he proudly calls "weak thought" and even "nihilism") provides the strongest possible foundation for a liberal-democratic political order. As a political philosophy, Vattimo's provocative work is surprisingly convincing and so deserves more critical attention in the English-speaking world.[3] As an interpretation of Heidegger, however, Vattimo's hermeneutics suffer from a serious problem. The issue is complicated, but to put it simply: Vattimo ends up treating the "nihilistic," Nietzschean position Heidegger opposes (namely, the reduction of being to nothing but becoming) as if it were Heidegger's own view and one we should all adopt (thereby becoming proud "nihilists" ourselves).

Santiago Zabala appropriates and extends Vattimo's Nietzschean interpretation of Heidegger in his new book, The Remains of Being: Hermeneutic Ontology after Metaphysics. That Zabala takes Vattimo's view as his own starting point is not surprising; Zabala is Vattimo's student, occasional co-author, and frequent editor. Indeed, as the editor of such translations of Vattimo's work as Nihilism and Emancipation: Ethics, Politics, and Law (2004), The Future of Religion (a dialogue with Vattimo and Rorty, 2007), and Art's Claim to Truth (2008); as well as of secondary volumes on Vattimo such as Weakening Philosophy (2009) and Consequences of Hermeneutics (with Jeff Malpas, 2010), Zabala has already become a leading exponent of Vattimo's thought. The Remains of Being is a relatively small book (the main text takes up only 125 5x7 inch pages), but it is far from introductory: Zabala rarely explains technical terminology, defends his views, or criticizes the views of others. The Remains of Being remains quite lively, nonetheless, for it is written in an energetic and dynamic style, with all the apparent conviction of an apostle of a new philosophical movement and with the excesses typical of such philosophical evangelism.

Zabala's book is a good example of the "Whig history" Rorty praised and practiced, that is, a narrative told so as to empower the narrator and "place rival canons" (as Rorty put it), in Zabala's case by trying to co-opt the views of other schools of post-Heideggerian philosophy. The Remains of Being is incredibly ambitious in this respect. For example, Zabala claims that the particular hermeneutic approach he advocates ("the ontology of remnants") "is the only way to philosophize" (16, my emphasis). Similarly, he holds that:

In the globalized world, where rapid ecological and political changes have been implemented by … scientific applications, in order to increase social divisions that favored two world wars (today we call them oil wars), the problem of Being becomes essential, because it is the only way to seek the ground of these issues. (34, my emphasis)

Here Zabala adopts a much simplified version of Heidegger's view that the most pressing problems facing the contemporary world stem from the "forgetting of being." Because Zabala does not seem to understand the details of Heidegger's critique of metaphysics as ontotheology, however, he goes so far as to call for us "to overthrow the metaphysical and scientific traditions that have concealed the ontological nature of Being in favor of the ontic nature of beings" (39, my emphasis). Zabala thinks "science … is involved in the abandonment of Being" (33) because "The scientist … works out solutions to problems that are objectified, timeless entities" (44). That is not Heidegger's view, however, and makes little sense of such leading scientific endeavors as the search at CERN for Higgs boson particles (theorized to last for only a small fraction of a second, and so hardly "timeless entities"). Heidegger's view is that physics has taken over the metaphysical tradition's ontotheological quest to secure both the innermost core and the outermost horizon of intelligibility. (The work at CERN, when coupled with other major scientific endeavors such as the Hubble space telescope, reinforces Heidegger's view of the persistence of ontotheology. Even Stephen Hawking's recent charge that "philosophy is dead" unintentionally acknowledges that physics and cosmology have adopted metaphysics' traditional ontotheological role.) Zabala's anti-scientific view rests on a misunderstanding of Heidegger.[4]

To be fair, Zabala warns readers that his "interpretation of these philosophers, including and most of all Heidegger, does not pretend to be a faithful interpretation of their thought" (xv). According to Zabala's simplified version of Heidegger's critique of metaphysics, our "rational way of looking at the world … has made unavoidable the alienated, unhoused, persistently violent state of modern technological human beings" (34). The biggest surprise here is that for Zabala (his revolutionary rhetoric notwithstanding), "overthrowing" the metaphysical tradition allegedly responsible for alienation, homelessness, and violence does not mean "overcoming" it but, instead, "learning to live with it" (45)! As Zabala succinctly puts it: "overcoming metaphysics from within" means "recognizing that it cannot completely be overcome" (22). This paradoxical idea is at the heart of Zabala's The Remains of Being, and it is something Zabala takes over from Vattimo.

Picking up on an insight from his teacher (and Heidegger's student) Hans-Georg Gadamer, Vattimo was one of the first to draw attention to the later Heidegger's mysterious claim that the danger of technologization and the promise of a postmodern understanding of being are two sides of the same coin. (Heidegger asserts, for example, that technological "enframing," Gestell, is the photographic negative of the "event" or "enowning," Ereignis; and he repeatedly notes that what he initially called the "nothing" must really be understood as "the noth-ing [or nihilating] of being as such.")[5] In Vattimo's attempt to make sense of these difficult but crucial claims, however, he ends up presenting Heidegger's critique of Nietzsche as if the Nietzschean position Heidegger criticizes were Heidegger's own view.[6] Heidegger does think Nietzsche is right that, for us late moderns, being has become nothing (because our Nietzschean understanding of being dissolves it into becoming). Yet, Heidegger presents this nihilistic reduction of being to nothing but becoming as an unfortunate result of our late-modern understanding of being, and thus as a view that any genuinely postmodern understanding of being must get beyond. Unlike Vattimo, then, Heidegger does not believe that Nietzsche's "nihilistic" reduction of being to nothing is something we should happily embrace as the unsurpassable horizon of our "post-metaphysical" age.[7]

In The Remains of Being, Zabala adopts and extends Vattimo's reading, seeking to assimilate a succession of post-Heideggerian thinkers (Reiner Schürmann, Jacques Derrida, Jean-Luc Nancy, Gadamer, and Ernst Tugendhat) to Vattimo's view. What makes The Remains of Being so interesting and original, but also so problematic, is the way Zabala seeks to show that these post-Heideggerian thinkers can all be explained in terms of Vattimo's interpretive framework, when in fact the effort repeatedly threatens to explode that hermeneutic framework from within. The Remains of Being ends up showing that Schürmann, Derrida, Nancy, and Gadamer all profoundly challenge Zabala's Vattimoian perspective, for each of these thinkers emphasizes a different way in which Heidegger's "being" is not simply nothing but, instead, continues to make itself intelligible, thereby suggesting paths beyond our late-modern horizon of intelligibility. Zabala's general strategy is to downplay these genuinely postmodern moments, reducing them to the "fragmentary" remnants that survive Heidegger's alleged destruction of being (6).[8] Zabala's provocative idea that Heidegger destroyed being will be a non-starter for most readers, since for Heidegger it is the Nietzschean metaphysics of technological enframing that reduces being to nothing, and Heidegger himself dedicates his later thought to transcending that nihilistic reduction of being to nothing. Nonetheless, Zabala's brief (6-8 pages) treatments of these "generational" interpretations of Heidegger remain lively and illuminating, even though part of what they illuminate is the difficulty Zabala has in assimilating their postmodern ideas into Vattimo's late-modern, hermeneutic framework.[9]

To wit, Schürmann argued that Heidegger's critique of metaphysics meant the end of all foundational systems of a certain kind; we can no longer believe that the ultimate ground of intelligibility can be captured in any foundational principle or "ontic referent" (60). This led Schürmann to articulate his own postmodern faith in an "anarchic," post-foundational age, in which "the quest for ultimate ontic referents" would be replaced by our creative responses to "the event of presencing" (60). What that postmodern hope meant was never very clear in Schürmann's Heidegger on Being and Acting: From Principles to Anarchy (1990), but it disappears entirely in Zabala's brief treatment. Zabala implicitly deflates and so transforms Schürmann's call for "postmetaphysics" (62), suggesting that the postmetaphysical age Schürmann seeks "is not history founding" (63). Instead, Schürmann's views "enjoin us to think in the sense of thanking, of submitting to economic mutations. Man is epochally summoned to summon entities that conform to his reason in order to guard aletheiological constellations" (62-3). In other words, we cannot get beyond metaphysics, so the best we can do is "submit" ourselves to the tradition in order to uncover its untried possibilities. Thus Schürmann becomes an antecedent of Vattimo, another advocate of the view that "philosophers … have only to respond thoroughly to the phenomenal disposition enclosing and situating them. Thinking becomes essentially compliant with the flux of coming-to-presence" (66). I do not think Schürmann is best understood as advancing such seemingly quietistic conclusions. For, following Heidegger himself, Schürmann called for us to immerse ourselves in the metaphysical tradition only in order to be able to get beyond it.[10]

Derrida is more convincingly presented as an antecedent of Vattimo, since Derrida's early critique of Heideggerian being as "the myth of the transcendental signified" and his related view that "there is nothing outside the text" bring Derrida much closer to Vattimo's hermeneutic perspective. Whereas Schürmann influentially stakes everything on the distinction between presence and presencing (since for Heidegger it is being's phenomenological presencing that promises to lead us beyond metaphysics), Derrida "collapses" that crucial Heideggerian distinction into the metaphysics of "presence" (69), Derrida's name for the metaphysical tradition in which he included Heidegger himself. According to Zabala, Derrida thinks that, for Heidegger himself, "Being has never meant anything other than beings" (69). Unfortunately, Zabala does not make it clear that Derrida is breaking with Heidegger here. In the same way that Vattimo conflates Heidegger's Nietzsche with Heidegger himself, Zabala writes as if Derrida presented us with the truth of Heidegger's view rather than a Saussure-inspired critique of it.

The underlying problem breaks through in Zabala's surprising claim that Derrida teaches us "the illusion of the presence of Being" (71). From what perspective could Derrida (or Zabala) claim that presence is an illusion? Perhaps if we assume that the Nietzschean ontotheology Heidegger criticizes has a monopoly on the real, so that what we perceive as "presence" is really just an illusory hypostatization of becoming. From Heidegger's phenomenological perspective, however, the claim that "the presence of being" is "an illusion" consigns us to nihilism, for it denies the truth and meaning of human experience. (Heidegger's view is that being cannot be reduced entirely to its presence, not that its presence is an illusion.)

Derrida's view fits Zabala's interpretive framework better than Schürmann's, but there is still some violence in the hermeneutic appropriation. For someone who wants to argue, as Zabala does, that there is nothing outside metaphysics, "the trace" is a strange topic on which to focus. For, as Zabala recognizes, the trace is Derrida's way of answering the question: "How can we name that which is other than the texts of Western metaphysics?" (70) The trace thematizes the (for Derrida paradoxical) way in which that which is outside all texts nevertheless makes itself felt within them, and it is not clear how Zabala can integrate this idea into his hermeneutic view that there is no being beyond metaphysics.

The problem reemerges in Zabala's treatment of Nancy. Zabala focuses on Nancy's treatment of "the unpresentability of presentation itself" (76-77). This is the idea that (in Derridean terms) the giving of the gift (of being) is not itself given, or that (in more phenomenological, later Heideggerian terms) our numbness to the immediate tends to lead us to overlook the dynamics of presencing in search of a more permanent presence. By reminding us of the limits of the metaphysical reduction of being to presence, Nancy means to help attune us to the dynamic presencing of being. Nancy thus reasserts the Heideggerian distinction between presence and presencing, the very distinction Zabala uses Derrida to challenge in Schürmann. For Heidegger, such phenomenological presencing is supposed to help lead us beyond our late-modern reduction of being to nothing, and it remains unclear how Zabala can account for it.

Zabala's motivation for treating Gadamer is clear: Gadamer's distinctive "dictum" that "being that can be understood is language" (79) sets the stage for the eclipse of phenomenology by hermeneutics in Vattimo, Gadamer's student. In Gadamer himself, however, being continues to make itself felt through the surprising insights that any genuine "conversation" delivers. As Zabala nicely puts it: "A genuine Gespräch is never the one we wanted to conduct but rather the one we fall into and become involved in as it develops; we are led by it instead of being the leaders of it" (81). Taking this insight seriously as a hermeneutic principle would help mitigate the tendency to impose a preexisting interpretive frame on the texts one reads, instead allowing those texts to surprise us and lead us away from some of the "prejudices" (83) with which we began (such as the Nietzschean idea that being is nothing but becoming).[11]

Zabala also clearly shows how Gadamer's substitution of "language" for Heidegger's "being" leads not just to the "panlinguisticism" Zabala defends Gadamer against (84), but also to the linguistic essentialism evident in Tugendhat, the view according to which there is no meaningful intelligibility outside language. Tugendhat proudly sees himself as "dissolving Being into the realm of semantics: statements, sentences, and propositions" (88). Like Derrida, "Tugendhat is convinced that there is no such thing as a reference to an object that is detached from a context of sentences" (88). Yet this is either a truism or an interesting but false claim. Either "reference" is being defined so narrowly that it makes the view true or else Tugendhat (like Rorty) is rejecting the idea that "philosophy has a prelinguistic subject matter."[12] Here, I think, the real cost of the eclipse of phenomenology by hermeneutics becomes evident. It may seem plausible to imagine that there is no meaningful way to be responsive to something outside language if one spends all one's time pushing words about words around on a page. But try asserting that a meaningful relation to the extralinguistic is a myth to a carpenter, a cook, an athlete, a teacher, a philosopher of art, or a phenomenologist.[13]

Zabala's Whig history reaches its climax with Vattimo, whom Zabala presents "as an indirect fusion of the other five systems" (93) and as the work "that best responds to Heidegger's call to 'work out Being for itself anew' and 'grasp its last remnant as a possession'" (92). For Vattimo, Zabala tells us, "The 'eventual' nature of Being is nothing but 'the disclosure of historico-linguistic horizons within which beings (things, men, etc.) come into presence'" (95, my emphasis). In Heideggerian terms, this means that being is nothing but the different historical understandings of the being of entities. Yet this leaves it entirely mysterious how our understanding of the being of entities could change, which perhaps helps explain why Vattimo and Zabala relinquish Heidegger's defining hope for a genuinely postmodern understanding of being and the new age of history which would come with it. As Zabala rightly puts it, Vattimo has "dissolved Being into its own 'becoming' interpretations" (95). But to dissolve being into becoming is the "fulfilled nihilism" Heidegger recognizes in Nietzsche; to attribute it to Heidegger himself is to Nietzscheanize Heidegger, which is exactly what Vattimo and Zabala do. Zabala calls this "an extension of Heidegger's interpretation of Nietzsche's nihilism" (97), but it is more of an entanglement in it than an extension of it.

Zabala's last chapter reasserts his Vattimoian view that "we cannot overcome metaphysics but only appropriate it, come to terms with it, or attempt to grasp its last resonance" (101). "Being is nothing other than its own remains" (107). The "nothing" was indeed Heidegger's first name for that which exceeds and makes possible our different historical understandings of the being of entities, but he meant to suggest the dynamic "noth-ing" or "nihilating" by which that which is not yet a thing presses in on us. By 1935, Heidegger was already beginning to talk of the "earth" instead of the "noth-ing," in order to suggest his more realist view that being pushes back in specific ways and thus is not merely a "nothing" with which we should do whatever we will (at least not if we hope to escape nihilism). Heidegger continues to improvise different names for this never finally nameable condition of the possibility of names, but "indeterminability, unpresentability, and ungraspability" (109) were not among his mature ways of describing being, precisely because they suggest the common Levinasian misreading of being as alterity, a forever ungraspable otherness, when in fact for Heidegger being is always partly graspable (that is where the content of our concepts comes from), just never completely exhaustible in conceptual terms.[14]

Despite these criticisms, Zabala's work remains valuable as a strong reading of Vattimo's "weak thought," an ambitious reading which seeks to appropriate the views of Vattimo's colleagues and competitors. In my view, however, Zabala reiterates rather than resolves the central problem in Vattimo's interpretation of Heidegger. To recognize this problem is to acknowledge the ineliminable difference between Nietzschean late-modernity and Heideggerian postmodernity, and so to reject Vattimo's idea that we should consign ourselves to nihilism as well as Zabala's claim that "Heidegger called on us to settle down and live within metaphysical traditions, languages and questions" (116). No, it is Vattimo and Zabala who call on us to do so. For Heidegger, that would be to abandon the hope of a genuinely meaningful postmodernity.[15]

[1]I address this hostility, while trying to clarify and defend the philosophical motives behind postmodernism, in Heidegger, Art, and Postmodernity (Cambridge University Press, forthcoming 2011).

[2]See the interesting account of his life thus far in Gianni Vattimo, with Piergiorgio Paterlini, Not Being God: A Collaborative Autobiography, W. McCuaig, trans. (Columbia University Press, 2009). Although Vattimo rarely matches that scholarly care and precision for which Giorgio Agamben is rightly esteemed, Vattimo is at least as creative, almost as provocative, and he is much more directly engaged with concrete political questions.

[3]See esp. Gianni Vattimo, Nihilism and Emancipation: Ethics, Politics, and Law, Santiago Zabala, ed., William McCuaig, trans. (Columbia UP, 2004).

[4]On Heidegger's much more nuanced and defensible view of the relation between philosophy and science, see my Heidegger on Ontotheology: Technology and the Politics of Education (Cambridge University Press, 2005), Ch. 3.

[5]I explain this crucial claim in "Understanding Technology Ontotheologically, or: The Danger and the Promise of Heidegger, an American Perspective," in J. K. B. Olsen, E. Selinger, and S. Riis, eds., New Waves in Philosophy of Technology (Palgrave Macmillan, 2009), pp. 146-66.

[6]Vattimo himself does rightly suggest that he is engaged in "a transformation of the notion of Being as such," a transformation which dispenses with "being as such" as something that exceeds the "being of entities." (See Vattimo, Nihilism and Emancipation, p. 3.)

[7]In other words, Vattimo's self-described "nihilism" misses (or tacitly rejects) Heidegger's own view of what it means to get beyond metaphysics. For Heidegger, the Nietzschean idea that being is ultimately nothing but becoming (or just an endless circulation of forces) is the way being shows up to us late moderns because we implicitly view it through the metaphysical lenses of our reigning Nietzschean ontotheology, which supplies our basic sense of what it means for anything to be.

According to Heidegger's reductive yet revealing reading of Nietzsche, we remain trapped in a Nietzschean ontotheology insofar as we implicitly understand the being of entities as eternally recurring will-to-power, that is, as an endless struggle between competing forces that works to maximally perpetuate force itself. This "technological" understanding of being tends to reduce everything we deal with to the status of mere Bestand, intrinsically-meaningless "resources" merely standing by to be optimized and ordered as efficiently as possible.

Unlike Vattimo, then, Heidegger does not believe we should simply embrace this nihilistic, "technological" understanding of being at the heart of our Nietzschean late modernity. In order to transcend it, however, Heidegger thinks we need to make a gestalt switch (hence his "photographic negative" image) in which, rather than reducing being to nothing but becoming, we instead recognize this "noth-ing or nihilating" of being as the way being becomes intelligible to us late moderns -- that is, as the way being's dynamic "presencing" (Anwesen) continues to show itself to our understanding and projects even when we view it through the lenses of our technological ontotheology.

Heidegger's esoteric point becomes clearer when put in phenomenological terms. To recognize and respond to being's "presencing," he suggests, is to understand and treat entities neither as modern objects to be controlled nor as late-modern resources to be optimized, but instead as postmodern things that both inform and exceed our capacity to express their being in conceptual terms. (It is, in Heidegger's philosophical terms of art, to understand "the being of entities" in terms of "being as such.") For example, a paradigmatic instance of our late-modern, technological understanding of being can be found in the way industrial factories grind wood into woodchips which are then glued back together into particle board, homogenous units that can be efficiently used in a maximal variety of useful applications. A postmodern understanding of being, by contrast, would instead cultivate a receptivity to the shape, grain, color, and weight of particular pieces of wood, so as to be able to creatively disclose at least one of the inchoate forms inherent in this wood, just as Michelangelo (whom Heidegger treats as a proto-postmodernist) brought forth his David only after spending a month studying the texture and grain of that legendary piece of marble so as to see what inchoate shapes and forms it suggested.

The "noth-ing" of being was only Heidegger's first name for such subtle hints, whereby the ubiquitous "presencing" of being lends itself to different possible ways of being taken up and made intelligible. Our late-modern, technological understanding of being turns a blind eye to this multiplicity of hints and, consequently, fails to cultivate the creative responsibility required to respond meaningfully to them. Instead, we late moderns tend blithely to impose preexisting plans without regard for the ways in which being continues to offer itself to our projects.

[8]At one point, Zabala does briefly thematize this central tension in his book, suggesting that the relation between Heidegger's reduction of being to nothing and the post-Heideggerian thinkers' recovery of the positive possibilities inherent in this "noth-ing" of being should be understood in terms of the relation between "'the remains of being' and 'Being's remnants,'" in which the former "conditions" the latter (6). The "remains of being" names the reduction of being to nothing (the "destruction of being" which, following Vattimo, Zabala repeatedly attributes to Heidegger himself rather than to Nietzsche); "Being's remnants" is Zabala's name for the ways being "survives" despite its alleged "destruction" by Heidegger (ibid.). To say the former "conditions" the latter is to say that the reduction of being to nothing makes possible the different "generative" encounters with this "noth-ing" among post-Heideggerian philosophers, each of whom supposedly shows how being continues to survive "in fragments" after its destruction. I think it is more plausible, however, to see these post-Heideggerian thinkers as redescribing in their own terms the same postmodern phenomena Heidegger first sought to describe, rather than as presenting us with radically new insights without analogue in Heidegger's own work.

[9]It turns out that the "metaphysics" Zabala wants to get beyond is not ontotheology, which Heidegger sees as the central ambition and core structure of the entire tradition of Western metaphysics, but only the modern metaphysical picture in which reality is composed of objects making themselves present to subjects. Thus Zabala quietly reduces Heidegger's critique of metaphysics as ontotheology to one of its five phases, namely, the modern "destruction of objectivistic metaphysics" (8). To join Zabala in seeking to destroy this objective weight means to undermine all attempts "to identify Being with the presence characteristic of objects" (9). This, however, would be merely to make the transition from modernity to late-modernity, and then (following Vattimo), to embrace this late modernity rather than seeking (with Heidegger) to get beyond it.

[10]Zabala does not engage with Schürmann's two posthumously published books, Broken Hegemonies (2003) and On Heidegger's Being and Time (with Simon Critchley, 2008).

[11]One of the underlying paradoxes in Zabala's view comes through in his suggestion that "what cannot be understood poses an endless task of finding the right word" (84). If something "cannot be understood," then what sense does it make to talk of finding "the right word" for it? And why would we try "endlessly" to do something impossible, rather than realize it was impossible and so give up, or at least alter our conception of what we were doing? If Zabala said instead: "what cannot yet be understood," then the paradox would disappear. But Zabala's commitment to Vattimo's idea that being is nothing prevents this. If being is instead understood (with the later Heidegger) as the inexhaustible source of intelligibility which partly lends itself to, but also partly escapes, all our attempts to nail down its meaning once and for all, then we can understand how we can endlessly seek to name it by finding what is, for a time, the right word. (Another of Zabala's quotations from Gadamer is apropos here: "in a conversation, it is something that comes to language" (85), something that was not yet recognized as a discrete thing until we articulated it, perhaps, but still not simply nothing.)

[12]See Rorty, "Philosophy as Science, Metaphor, Politics," in Essays on Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers Volume 2 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991), p. 23.

[13]In fact, as Zabala says, "our understanding constantly transcends its articulation in sentences" (92). Unfortunately, Zabala does not make clear that to recognize this (early Heideggerian) point is already to reject Tugendhat's untenable linguistic essentialism. The hermeneutic problem is that Zabala presents Tugendhat's reduction of intelligibility to propositions as if this were a Heideggerian view, when in fact it completely misses Heidegger's central argument in Division I of Being and Time that the thematic cognition typical of propositions is grounded in and derives its intelligibility from a prior level of non-thematic, practical engagement. Here Rorty would have fit Zabala's narrative and set up the culminating pages on Vattimo better. For Vattimo will rightly insist on the importance of the "historical horizon in which only [i.e., alone] every specific sentence gains sense" (94), something for which Tugendhat himself cannot account.

[14]This plural realism is the point behind Heidegger's otherwise mystical sounding claims that "it is Being that throws … not Dasein" (110). A religious thinker like Vattimo may be happy with the idea that "Being is an event, a kind of initial generosity and gift through which philosophy began" (xi, my italics), but this risks falsely suggesting that being no longer makes itself felt, that its presencing is a thing of the past. Indeed, just such a view seems to underwrite Zabala's recurring idea that we should now dedicate ourselves to hermeneutic engagements with the past texts in which that presencing is preserved, rather than also continuing to elaborate to the phenomenological efforts required to encounter those phenomena directly for ourselves.

[15]For Heidegger, our historical age is essentially characterized by such collisions between late-modern and postmodern ways of understanding what it means to be. These collisions turn on the question: Can something at least partly independent of us meaningfully inform our projects (as Kierkegaard and Heidegger think), or are all such postulations of inherent meaning just subjective projections smuggled into our conception of reality (as Nietzsche, Marx, and Freud suggest)? Heidegger dedicates himself to defending the former view, the idea that the source of all genuine meaning is at least partly independent from us, so that we need to cultivate the skills for responding creatively and responsibly to its multiple solicitations. He sets this view against the latter, Nietzschean idea that all meaning ultimately comes from us, as a result of our various "value positings." For Heidegger, this is the essential struggle at the heart of the present age, the "fateful" issue which determines whether human beings live meaningful or nihilistic lives. From a Heideggerian perspective, then, the problem with Vattimo and Zabala, stated simply (and so provocatively), is that although they present themselves as post-Heideggerian and postmodern thinkers, they are actually on Nietzsche's late-modern side in this "fateful" struggle.

Heidegger did think that we could only reach his postmodern view by pushing all the way through the late-modern, Nietzschean view (by recognizing that being is not nothing but, instead, that this "noth-ing" names being's continuing solicitations), but that is not something we are likely to do if, following Vattimo and Zabala, we simply insist that being is nothing and present this late-modern, Nietzschean position as unsurpassable. For Heidegger did not share the historical materialists' faith that the transformation from one age to the next is a teleological necessity, so that one can unknowingly help usher in the next age merely by redoubling one's commitments to the current one (as a staunch capitalist inadvertently contributes to bringing about the communist revolution). Instead, Heidegger repeatedly stressed that we need first to understand the distinctive nature of the possible historical transition we face if we are to help bring it about. Without such efforts, Heidegger thought a genuinely postmodern understanding of being might never displace the nihilistic technological understanding of being at the core of our late modern age.